Evolving Enactivism: Basic Minds Meet Content

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Daniel D. Hutto and Erik Myin, Evolving Enactivism: Basic Minds Meet Content, MIT Press, 2017, 360pp. $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036115.

Reviewed by Evan Thompson, University of British Columbia


For almost three decades, cognitive science has accommodated a creative tension between the traditional computational view of the mind, which downplays the importance of the physical body, and embodied cognitive science, which emphasizes that cognition strongly depends on the body. According to the proponents of embodied cognitive science, the dependence of cognition on the body is both causal -- the body beyond the brain plays a significant causal role in cognitive activity -- and constitutive -- the body is a proper part of the cognitive system. Embodied cognitive science encompasses a variety of philosophical viewpoints and empirical research programs. Some approaches try to revise the traditional models of computation, mental representation, and agency by grounding them on functional models of the physical body; other approaches depart from the computational tradition by rejecting its core assumptions about the mind. This book belongs to the second camp.

Daniel Hutto and Erik Myin call their theory the "Radical Enactive, Embodied account of Cognition" ("REC"). According to this account, "basic mind" or "basic cognition" is "contentless." "Basic cognition" means all cognitive activities except those involving public language and cultural symbol systems. "Content" means possessing correctness conditions (accuracy or truth conditions). Hutto and Myin argue that basic cognition does not involve being in contentful states of mind, where "to be in a contentful state is to take ('represent,' 'claim,' 'say,' 'assert') things to be a certain way such that they might not be so" (p. 10). Content-involving cognition requires public symbols and social practices of symbolic communication; it is governed by semantic norms and has correctness conditions. The claim that basic cognition is contentless is said to make the account "radical" compared to "conservative" theories that are committed to a content-involving account of all cognition. The book's principal aim (announced in its subtitle) is to explain how basic cognition and content-involving cognition combine in human cognition.

Hutto and Myin build on their earlier book, Radicalizing Enactivism (MIT Press, 2013). This was largely a polemic directed against contentful views of the mind. The present book is advertised as a positive account (p. xv). Nevertheless, the authors devote a large amount of their efforts to addressing critics of their earlier book. They do not systematically construct a positive account from the ground up; instead, they defend their claim that basic cognition is contentless by analyzing and criticizing other theories. They call this procedure "RECtification," which they describe as "a process through which the target accounts of cognition are radicalized by analysis and argument, rendering them compatible with REC" (p. xviii). The accounts of cognition singled out for rectification include predictive processing theories (Hohwy 2013; Clark 2016), ecological dynamics (Chemero 2009), the enactive approach (Varela et al. 1991; Thompson 2007; Froese and Di Paolo 2011), and teleosemantics (Millikan 2005). Hutto and Myin put forth their account by trying to combine and revise these theories so that they do not include any commitment to content-involving cognition.

In my estimation, this way of proceeding -- by analyzing and criticizing other theories instead of starting from basic theoretical and empirical issues and using them to motivate the careful construction of a positive theoretical framework with testable models -- is not a good way to proceed in cognitive science. Further, as explained below, I do not think that the authors succeed in presenting a positive account.

Although Hutto and Myin are good at criticizing representational theories, they are sloppy with the embodied cognitive science theories they try to rectify: (i) Anthony Chemero's (2009) concept of "information pickup" is not "anathema to a nonrepresentationalist reading of Gibson" (p. 86); on the contrary, it is entirely faithful to Gibson's nonrepresentationalist conception of information as directly specifying affordances. (ii) The enactive approach is not accurately called "autopoietic-adaptive enactivism." (I will explain why later.) (iii) The enactive approach does not maintain that only a subset of living organisms exhibit autonomy and agency (p. 76), but rather that all organisms exhibit basic autonomy and basic agency. (iv) There never has been such a thing as "pure autopoietic versions of enactivism" (ibid.). (v) The definition given of the enactive concept of adaptivity is imprecise and uninformative (p. 77).

The book contains a dozen acronyms. They are unnecessary and bothersome to remember. They figure in unattractive neologisms ("RECtifying," "REConnecting") and clunky phrases ("RECish radicalizing," p. 88).

Hutto and Myin's thesis that basic cognition is contentless rests on their negative assessment of naturalistic theories of content. The problem is to bridge from information-as-covariance (A carries information about B because A lawfully covaries with B) to full-blown semantic content (A means B), involving reference, truth, or accuracy (correctness conditions). Some philosophers have placed their hopes in teleosemantic theories, which appeal to the teleology of biological functions as derived from natural selection, to explain meaning. Hutto and Myin allow that teleosemantic theories can account for biological functional norms, but they deny that semantic norms are derivable from biological functional norms. Specifying the biological function of a given state does not suffice for specifying the state's semantic content. Hutto and Myin enlist well-known arguments from Jerry Fodor (1990) that the biological function of a state is not fine-grained enough to determine a unique semantic content for the state. For example, determining that the biological function of one of the frog's visuomotor states is to snap at flies is not enough to determine under what description that state represents its object (e.g., as a fly versus as a small, moving black dot). In Fodor's words: "Darwin doesn't care how you describe the intentional object of fly snaps . . . Darwin cares how many flies you eat, but not what description you eat them under" (Fodor 1990, p. 73, quoted by Hutto and Myin, p. 44).

Hutto and Myin, however, deny that the frog targets the fly by representing it under a description having correctness conditions. The frog's behavior is an example of basic cognition, a nonsemantic form of world-involving cognition whose intentionality (directedness) consists in targeting an object without contentfully representing it. Hutto and Myin call this kind of "target-focused" and "contentless" intentionality "ur-intentionality." Basic cognition and ur-intentionality are not limited to creatures like frogs, for "plenty of human cognition is basic" (p. 135). To explain basic cognition and ur-intentionality, Hutto and Myin advocate using "teleosemiotics," a content-purged version of teleosemantics, according to which certain states of organisms have the biological function of targeting objects and situations without contentfully representing them. (Peter Godfrey-Smith (2006) proposed this idea, though he did not use the term "teleosemiotics.") According to the authors, "contentless notions of information-as-covariance and the norms of biological functionality offer all that is needed for understanding basic minds" (p. 41).

To get from basic minds to content-involving minds, both ontogenetically and phylogenetically, requires social cognition and public symbol systems. Hutto and Myin propose a two-step sequence. The first requirement is basic (contentless) social cognition, in which individuals are said to target each other and their targeting attitudes without representing them under descriptions with correctness conditions:

individuals can respond to the environment and to each other in ways that allow for emulation, imitation, and regulation of what they target and attend to in ways that make basic forms of social learning possible . . . all that needs to be assumed is that normally developing participants in such practices are already set up, nonaccidentally, to target and tune into the expressively rich intentional attitudes of others (p. 140).

The second requirement is public symbol systems governed by sociocultural norms. Social cognition becomes content-involving only "when special sorts of sociocultural norms are in place" (p. 145). These norms "depend on the development, maintenance, and stabilization of practices involving the use of public symbol systems through which the biologically inherited cognitive capacities can be scaffolded in particular ways" (ibid.). The crucial practices are "claim-making practices . . . because they require participants not only to respond to things but to do so by representing them as being thus and so independently of what might be said about them" (ibid.).

Beyond stating this proposal, however, Hutto and Myin do not elaborate and support it with descriptions, analyses, or explanatory models of cognitive phenomena involving social learning, social cognition, and language. Instead, they switch to fending off critics (see p. 140). Although they claim to be doing naturalistic philosophy and deplore "the general tendency of philosophers -- especially those in some wings of the analytic tradition -- to assume that the essence of phenomena can be investigated independently of science" (p. 276) -- they do not draw from the rich cognitive science literature on how sociocultural practices and public symbol systems configure cognition. (I have in mind work by Lev Vygotsky, Merlin Donald, and Edwin Hutchins.)

In the same vein, Chapter 8 purports to give an account of how content-involving imagination scaffolds basic (contentless) sensory imaging, and Chapter 9 purports to give an account of how content-involving, narrative remembering scaffolds basic (contentless) episodic remembering. Basic sensory imaging is said to be the targeting of an object by a sensory image without correctness conditions; basic episodic remembering is said to be a kind of simulation without correctness conditions; and contentful attitudes resulting from social claim-making practices are said to scaffold basic imagining and remembering into content-involving imagining and remembering. Again, Hutto and Myin assert these ideas but leave them undeveloped. Instead, they go back to criticizing representational theories of imagination and content-storage models of memory.

Fending off critics and rival theories with philosophical arguments does not a cognitive science theory make. Hutto and Myin do not provide an explanatory model of how social cognition and public symbols systems in tandem with basic cognition generate contents. They do not explain how social cognition and public symbol systems can come into being without the prior existence of mental contents. They have given not so much a positive account as a proposal for an account.

I have problems with the proposal. I disagree with Hutto and Myin's way of using the term "content." They insist that content entails correctness conditions. They also apparently think that only representations can have correctness conditions. So, any form of intentionality (cognitive directedness) that lacks correctness conditions or is not representational is said to be contentless. These moves amount to handing the concept of content over to the representational theory of mind. They also conflate two issues: (i) can there be content without correctness conditions; and (ii) can there be correctness conditions without representations?

Phenomenologists and embodied cognitive scientists have long argued that the intentional content of basic (nonlinguistic) cognition is not representational content: it does not consist of contents that are "carried" by (encoded in) "vehicles" (states) inside the agent and that stand for (or stand in for) referents outside and independent of the agent. For example, Hutto and Myin mention Hubert Dreyfus's (2002) thesis that absorbed skillful action exhibits a form of intentionality that does not involve propositional mental representations or semantically interpretable brain representations. Dreyfus supports his thesis by combining analyses and arguments from Merleau-Ponty's Phenomenology of Perception with Walter Freeman's electrophysiological and dynamical system models of brain function. Merleau-Ponty and Freeman both argue that representationalism, according to which cognition consists of state transitions between internal mental or neuronal representations, does not explain basic cognition at either the psychological or neurophysiological levels. Neither theorist, however, would say that basic cognition is contentless; on the contrary, their concern is to describe a basic kind of intentional content that is not representational. Nor would they say that the intentional content has no satisfaction conditions, in the sense that it is not subject to norms. Dreyfus follows suit when he argues that the immediate response to how one is solicited by a situation has content and is subject to norms of perception and action, but the content and satisfaction conditions are not representational.

Hutto and Myin, however, urge that we should describe basic cognition as involving "contentless intentionality rather than nonrepresentational intentionality" (p. 102). For phenomenologists, this nomenclature makes no sense, because intentionality and content are correlative. If basic intentionality is not representational, then it has nonrepresentational content. Hutto and Myin tell us that this way of talking is "lax and liberal" (p. 12), "utterly anodyne," and "likely to breed only confusion," "since most analytic philosophers assume that content entails correctness conditions" (p 102). But this response begs or skirts the question of whether all correctness conditions (e.g., perceptual norms) require mental representations. Moreover, restricting the discussion to what "most analytic philosophers assume" is inappropriate and seems narrow minded, given that phenomenology has been so influential in embodied cognitive science. (I doubt that "analytic" is a useful term in this context.)

Hutto and Myin think that the phenomenological concept of nonrepresentational intentional content means "simply whatever object a given intentional attitude targets or is directed at" (p. 102). But intentional content also includes how the object is presented to the targeting attitude. Specifying intentional content requires characterizing not just the object per se, but also how the object appears to the agent, including the significance and relevance it has for the agent, given the agent's bodily and cognitive skills, and affective and motivational tendencies.

Can the intentionality of basic cognition be accounted for without invoking the notion of an intentional object's mode of presentation to the agent? We need to distinguish among several issues: What are modes of presentation? Does basic cognition constitutively involve modes of presentation? Are all modes of presentation representational, or are there nonrepresentational modes of presentation? Specifically, does basic cognition constitutively involve nonrepresentational modes of presentation? When Hutto and Myin claim that "ur-intentionality" directly targets its object, it may be that they mean to deny the model of intentionality in which it consists of an object, an act or attitude, and a mode of presentation. But although they argue that basic cognition is not representational, they do not provide any argument to show that it does not involve modes of presentation. They mention the idea (which they attribute to Hans D. Muller (2014), but which originally comes from Carl Sachs (2012)) that "there is intentional content to which Frege's sense-reference distinction does not apply" (p. 103). They go on to say, "to let go of the idea of a sense-reference distinction, while retaining the idea of some kind of intentional directedness . . . is actually to go the REC way" (p. 103). But Frege's sense-reference distinction concerns language and linguistic thought. We are still left with the question of whether basic cognition, which is nonlinguistic, involves nonrepresentational modes of presentation. Phenomenologists maintain that it does.

Hutto and Myin need to address these issues to turn their proposal into an account. Although they are good at highlighting the problems with the concept of representational content used as an explanatory tool in cognitive science, they provide little in the way of an alternative theory of intentionality.

For example, in their critique of predictive processing theories, they rely heavily on a distinction between "contentless embodied expectations" or "anticipations" and "contentful predictions" (pp. 70-74). I accept that there are embodied and dynamical forms of anticipatory basic cognition that do not rely on contentful predictions encoded by inferentially related representations in the brain. But I do not see how it is supposed to follow that the agent's basic anticipatory targeting of X does not include a mode of presentation of X to the agent. If Hutto and Myin think that it does follow, they need to explain why. If they have other grounds for thinking that "embodied anticipations" do not involve modes of presentation, they need to explain their reasons.

Note that a mode of presentation does not have to be equated either with an internal mental entity that stands for an object or with simply the object per se. Rather, it can be a profile or aspect of the object that stands out as relevant or significant only given the agent and its sensorimotor capacities. Such a mode of presentation is relational (constituted by the agent-environment coupling) and does not have correctness conditions in the representationalist sense (though it may be subject to other kinds of norms).

This relational conception of the intentional content of basic cognition is central to both ecological dynamics (Chemero 2009) and the enactive approach (Varela, Thompson, and Rosch 1991; Thompson 2007; Di Paolo et al. 2017). The enactive approach is based on the thesis that basic cognition is not mediated or constituted by internal semantic representations (elements whose internal structure and causal role make them stand for things outside themselves, which they match or fail to match, according to correctness conditions). But the enactive approach does not claim that basic cognition is contentless or that it is not subject to intentional norms that are irreducible to biological norms.

My final comments concern Hutto and Myin's use of the term "enactive." They do not define or explain the word. They use it loosely and liberally to refer to a cluster of ideas held together by a view of cognition as dynamic, interactive, relational, embodied, and at least not fundamentally or essentially representational. The price to pay for using the word in this vague way is philosophical and scientific imprecision.

The enactive approach is a cognitive science research program based on two interconnected pillars (see Varela et al. 1991; Thompson 2007; Di Paolo et al. 2017). One pillar is the rejection of the representational theory of mind, the emphasis on the dynamics of agent-environment sensorimotor coupling, and the thesis that embodied interaction is constitutive of cognition. The other pillar is the concept of biological autonomy. The basic idea is that living beings generate and maintain themselves. Stated more abstractly, an autonomous system is a self-generating and self-sustaining system. The theory of autonomous systems takes living systems as the paradigm and focuses on explaining the emergence and constitution of individuality, agency, and functional and behavioral norms. The theory of agent-environment coupling focuses on explaining cognition. For an account to be "enactive" in the full and precise sense of the term, it must include both theoretical projects. In contrast, both ecological dynamics and the sensorimotor contingency theory of perception (sometimes called "sensorimotor enactivism") focus only on the sensorimotor coupling part of the story (and, as Hutto and Myin note, the sensorimotor contingency theory has often been presented in a representationalist way).

Hutto and Myin's distinction between "radical" enactivism and "conservative" enactivism makes sense only given the loose use of "enactive." It has no bearing on the enactive approach defined properly.

Hutto and Myin use the term "autopoietic-adaptive enactivism" to refer to the enactive approach. The word is a misnomer for several reasons. First, no exponent of the enactive approach uses it. Second, "autopoiesis" refers to the kind of autonomy found at the level of the single biological cell. The theory of autopoiesis provides a paradigm for conceptualizing and modeling the autonomy of living beings at the level of single-cell metabolism. "Autonomy," however, is the generic concept. It is the conceptual tool directly relevant to explaining individuality and agency. Third, "adaptive" stands for "adaptivity," which refers to the capacity of an autonomous system to regulate itself in relation to conditions registered as viable versus unviable, or improving versus deteriorating. All living organisms are autonomous and adaptive. Maybe someday an artificial agent or robot will be too.

In addition, central to the enactive approach is a critique and critical rejection of the adaptationist and selectionist perspective in biology that underwrites teleosemantics and Hutto and Myin's teleosemiotics. Hutto and Myin propose that teleosemiotics can explain the "natural origins of content." Proponents of the enactive approach have long argued that the selectionist theory of teleological biological functions is insufficient for explaining the autonomy of living beings and biological functional norms. Hutto and Myin do not consider these arguments.

Finally, the enactive approach strives to build bridges between phenomenological analyses and investigations of the lived experience of cognition and cognitive science theories and models. Such bridge-building includes bringing phenomenological methods for exploring first-person experience into scientific investigations of consciousness, especially in cognitive neuroscience. Hutto and Myin make no mention of this part of the enactive project.

Because of these misunderstandings and oversights, Hutto and Myin fail to connect with the enactive approach, and so are not in a good position to rectify or otherwise revise it.

In summary, Hutto and Myin are good gadflies. Philosophers and cognitive scientists need to be reminded of the problems with representationalism in its traditional and newfangled forms. But this book does not provide a positive alternative account, and it is enactive mostly in name only.


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