Excellent Beauty: The Naturalness of Religion and the Unnaturalness of the World

Placeholder book cover

Eric Dietrich, Excellent Beauty: The Naturalness of Religion and the Unnaturalness of the World, Columbia University Press, 2015, 191pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231171021.

Reviewed by Taede A. Smedes, Dominican Institute for Theology and Society (DSTS)


Many people intuitively tend to think that religion deals with the sacred, with awe and mystery, while science deals with the natural world, which it strips of wonder and “disenchants” (to use a phrase by the sociologist Weber). However, Eric Dietrich claims in this book that that intuition turns out flat wrong and makes a case for exactly the opposite. Religion is a purely biological phenomenon and makes claims that are falsified by science. It is not religion but science that is the true source of perplexing but beautiful mysteries. These mysteries, so Dietrich argues, can become the rational substitute for religious belief.

The argument looks familiar, but this book should not be ranked with the philosophically unsophisticated ramblings of “new atheists” like Richard Dawkins or Sam Harris. Dietrich does respect religion, at least at its core (which means: the sense of sacredness of holiness, out of which religion emerged), but he claims that when it comes to a sense of mystery, science nowadays does a better job.

It is clear that Dietrich has no optimistic view of the relationship between science and religion. Science and religion clash, according to Dietrich:

religion makes factual, usually supernatural claims about the universe, about our world, that science refutes. . . . They both claim to discover and establish truths, but when the truths are of the same kind (ontological, factual truths), which happens often, science wins every time (19, 20-21).

Dietrich even speaks about a “war” between science and religion, a war which science has won (xiv). Because religion makes claims that science debunks, religion is deeply irrational, and that is why One Billion people globally have left religion. With the “One Billion”, Dietrich refers to the growing group of the “non-religious” or “nones”: those who say they do not have any religious affiliation.

But leaving religion behind does not entail leaving spirituality behind. And that is what the book aims at: showing how science can become a source for an atheist spirituality (although Dietrich nowhere makes explicit what exactly he means by “spiritual” or “spirituality”). Thus, as Dietrich writes, the book is structured “as a travelogue, as the progress report of a sort of journey — a journey to a realm revealed by science, but unexplained by it. . . . I want to move the reader, at least temporarily, from religious mysteries to the scientific ones” (xv).

Dietrich invites the reader to join his own spiritual journey, which means leaving religion and entering “the dark night of the soul”, the realm of existential doubt and anxiety, due to suffering and being confronted with the randomness without the religious explanations that were previously used to make sense of the randomness. In a sense, the dark night of the soul, for Dietrich, is the loss of the feeling of being in control. And because of this loss, we turn to science to give us explanations. Leibniz’ “Principle of Sufficient Reason” is in a sense a belief in universal causation that is able to restore our faith in the world. And so, Dietrich concludes, we come full circle: “In spite of all the pain in the world, and in spite of one billion nonreligious people professing indifference to religion, most humans remain religious, and many are deeply religious” (44). Humans are incurably religious, which raises the question: “why are we religious; why do we believe in God, gods, angels, and demons?” (45).

The second part of the book is devoted to this question. Dietrich argues that the different aspects of religion are biological in origin. Religion stems from the way our brains function. For instance, our “hyperactive agency detection device” makes us mistakenly recognize a nonagent as an agent, which explains “why we naturally gravitate toward supernatural explanations of events” (60). Our brain functions as a “fiction-generating device” (68) that kicks in whenever a coincidence occurs.

Dietrich argues that from an evolutionary perspective, religion was once a good invention that had positive survival values. The social and moral aspects of religion are rooted in prosocial behavior and were a stabilizing factor in early human societies. But nowadays “the fact that we use religion to insult, harm, repress, maim, enslave, torture, and kill other people and other animals is vastly outweighing any good religion does” (81). Moreover, looking at several moral theories, such as consequentialism and the deontological view, Dietrich argues “that we don’t need religion at all to have even a very strong sort of morality and deep moral commitments” (89).

So, in the third part of the book, Dietrich draws the conclusion from the foregoing that humans are “janus-faced”: apparently we are both rational creatures and religious by nature: “We are not just inclined to be religious and scientifically rational, we are both religious and scientifically rational. Furthermore, these natures are not just opposing, but contradictory” (106). We can’t get rid of one of them, we need to accept that we are both. But how do we do that? How do we come clean with our contradictory nature?

In the fourth and final part Dietrich seeks “a worthy replacement for our religious strivings” (115). We need to satisfy our religious side, but not by inventing supernatural entities. So Dietrich turns to science, to what he calls the scientific mysteries or “excellent beauties” of science that “reveal that our world is not flatly natural” (115). These are mysteries that exist “objectively for all to see” (116). Science, according to Dietrich, reveals to us a universe that allows us to see more than we can understand.

Dietrich describes three examples of such excellent beauties in more detail. (In an appendix to chapter 10 Dietrich provides a brief “compendium” of even more scientific mysteries.) One is consciousness. Dietrich already in the beginning of the book writes that he accepts David Chalmers’s dualism, and in the tenth chapter argues further that consciousness is one of the profound mysteries that science is not able to explain adequately. It may be that science eventually will go a long way in explaining consciousness, but there still is a barrier that science will not be able to cross, and that is that external, third-person knowledge will never be able to explain my internal, first-person experience of consciousness. The second awe-inspiring scientific mystery is infinity, which he illustrates by the cardinality of real numbers. And third there is “the rarity of the commonplace”, that seeing the wonder and strangeness of our ordinary, everyday existence, caught between the cosmological dimensions of the “very large” and the “very small” of the quantum realm.

These excellent beauties, so Dietrich argues in the final pages, “suggest not only that some things are not understandable, but that nothing is fully understandable, if for no other reason than that full understanding requires understanding any given thing’s complex relationships to every other thing in the universe” (168). Thus Dietrich urges the reader to adopt a new “epistemic attitude” which focuses on provisionality: “the attitude that any thing we know is known by us only provisionally” (168). In the end, this comes down to learning to live with ignorance and randomness.

Now, there are many things that can be said about this book, but when I started reading it, for me the crucial questions were, first, whether the book treated religion fairly, and second, whether Dietrich would be able to present a viable atheist spirituality. My assessment will gravitate around these two issues.

On the back of the book, Deepak Chopra praises it as “the perfect answer to dogmatic atheism and religious fundamentalism, two dangerous trends in our polarized world. For me, just reading this book became a spiritual experience!” I doubt whether Chopra has really read the book. For Dietrich argues for a substitution view. We should get rid of religion and focus our innate religious yearnings (at one point Dietrich writes religion “is written into the human genome” (157)) to the awe-inspiring mysteries that science reveals. Dietrich thus not only argues merely against religious fundamentalists, as Chopra thinks, but against religion in general.

Now, to criticize religion is not such a bad thing if one takes religion seriously and fairly. But alas, Dietrich reduces religion to matters of opinion. For a philosopher, Dietrich’s views on religion are strikingly naïve and stereotypical and occasionally do not really differ much from the unsophisticated ideas of Dawkins and Harris. Take for example this passage:

Being scientifically rational requires seeking evidence, especially evidence refuting a specific belief. It requires taking this evidence seriously and changing our beliefs if the evidence demands it. Being religious requires us to ignore evidence, especially refuting evidence. Being scientifically rational requires us to look for natural causes of events. Being religious requires us to look for supernatural (non-natural) causes of events. Being religious requires us to think that there is something holy either in the world or behind the world. Being scientific requires viewing the world as flatly natural. (106)

I wonder whether Dietrich has ever set foot in a theological faculty or even talked to a theologian. Is such a view of religion that relies on nothing but cultural stereotypes and gut feelings really worthy of a professional philosopher?

Religion in Dietrich’s view thus is nothing but a matter of (false or debunked) beliefs. Religion starts with beliefs, and religious practices are derived from them (or so it seems; he does not really go into the practical side of religion). According to Dietrich religion clashes with science on the level of doctrines and claims about matters of fact. He believes that science is a surer way to knowledge and thus religion should be rejected.

Others, however, will want to argue that religion is not a matter of opinion but first of all a set of practices and that the matters of opinion (the doctrines) are a byproduct of the rational reflection upon those practices. It is highly dubitable how the scientific mysteries that Dietrich points to can ever result in a substitute for the religious practices.

There are other atheists who also argue for a substitution view. For example, Alain de Botton, in his Religion for Atheists from 2013, has argued that atheists can safely reject religious doctrines but that they should cherish other aspects of religion, such as rituals and religious art. De Botton is aware that religion offers more than mere opinions about or supernatural explanations of certain states of affairs. If atheism wants to become more than a worldview that is defined by what it does not believe, then atheists could look at the way religious rituals function to learn to develop their own positive approach to life and meaning. Of course, other atheists like Dawkins or Harris have ridiculed De Botton’s ideas because they believe it makes atheism into a new religion. Whatever one thinks about De Botton’s ideas, at least De Botton is aware that religion serves many functions and is not merely about beliefs but first of all (or, perhaps even more) a matter of practices that are valuable in themselves.

So I conclude that Dietrich fails to give a fair and balanced view of religion. But I also doubt whether his view of the “excellent beauties” that science reveals are adequate to establish an atheist spirituality.

That scientific knowledge can give rise to feelings of awe and wonder can be gleaned from the writings of Albert Einstein and Carl Sagan. More recently, religious naturalists such as Ursula Goodenough, Chet Raymo, Jerome Stone, and Loyal Rue have written sophisticated works on finding the sacred in everyday life without the need for God. Though these naturalists do conclude that the feelings of awe and wonder point to something that cannot be adequately captured in a scientific framework, unlike Dietrich they see no need to argue for an “epistemology of the gaps” that focuses on what is scientifically unexplainable for a naturalist spirituality. Indeed, one of Raymo’s books has the title When God is Gone, Everything is Holy, pointing to the fact that also what is known is awesome and wondrous. Moreover, in contrast to Dietrich, these naturalists acknowledge the multifaceted nature of religion. They have moved beyond the idea that religion is mere false belief that draws its life from contradicting science. Moreover, these naturalists acknowledge that pointing to limits of understanding or pointing to the scientifically unexplainable is just not enough for a naturalist spirituality.

So, these naturalists, instead of polarizing, have decided to actually engage in a constructive dialogue with religion. They do so because they believe, similarly to De Botton, that religion has useful resources that can be used in a naturalist spiritual framework. For example, Goodenough and Raymo use religious language of the sacred but without references to the supernatural. These approaches, in my view, are much more constructive than Dietrich, who remains stuck in polarizing modes of thought.

Though Dietrich’s book is quite well-written and obviously meant to appeal to a broad audience, almost without philosophical jargon and with references kept to an absolute minimum, it contains hardly any truly new or original ideas. If it had come out, say, in 2006, it perhaps could have been a welcome contribution to the new atheist rhetoric. But now, almost ten years later, I cannot but conclude that Dietrich missed the bus, on many points.