Excessive Subjectivity: Kant, Hegel, Lacan, and the Foundations of Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Dominik Finkelde, Excessive Subjectivity -- Kant, Hegel, Lacan, and the Foundations of Ethics, Deva Kemmis and Astrid Weigert (trs.), Columbia University Press, 2017, 340pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231173186.

Reviewed by Klas Roth, Stockholm University


Dominik Finkelde argues that "there are no 'excessive subjects' but only 'excessive subjectivity'" (76). The latter is, for him, a structural force "that breaks with the context of established ethical life" (5) and cannot be assimilated, either with "the Kantian/formalistic [sense of excessive subjects] nor . . . the Hegelian/pragmatic tradition of ethics" (5). In his opinion it exceeds their work, and is on "a more solid footing" (6) with psychoanalyst Jacques Lacan's work, which in turn is inspired by the work of Kant and Hegel. Finkelde also believes that representatives of excessive subjectivity make change possible, and that an apostle of excessive subjectivity makes desirable change possible.

This is a bold and remarkable book. In the introduction Finkelde draws our attention to what he considers to be a neglected topic: that of excessive subjectivity and the necessity of the deed. Then comes a chapter on Kant, followed by a shorter one on Hegel and a lengthier one on Lacan.

After having set the agenda in the introduction, Finkelde argues in the chapter on Kant that a sudden change in one's disposition or in one's character makes it possible to perform deeds that can lead to something new and constructive. However, he opposes Kant in his discussion of the sudden change of disposition in his Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason (1998b), claiming that the moral law does not motivate new and constructive change; it is rather the force of the Real, in Lacanian terms, that makes the change of one's disposition possible. He also opposes Kant, arguing that people cannot know exactly what to do in particular situations with regard to the moral law, and whether their deeds will lead to something new and constructive. He thinks that the value of their deeds can be acknowledged only retrospectively. He believes, therefore, that there are no excessive subjects, but only excessive subjectivity. That is, there cannot be any excessive subjects in Kantian terms, since that would require them to be motivated by the moral law in the sudden change of disposition or character, and to know what the value of their deeds would be in relation to the moral law, which, as we see, he contests.

Finkelde also opposes, for similar reasons, the work of Christine Korsgaard, a Kantian who argues that people have a duty to make themselves efficacious and autonomous with regard to the moral law.[1] He favors instead Alenka Zupančič's work, which, in his opinion, brings to the fore Kant's notion of disposition or character together with Lacan's notion of the Real.[2] Finkelde believes that this connection makes it possible for Lacan to endow "the subject with an autonomous subversive performative power of imposing [new] norms and values" (171) and breaking with the old -- more on this below.

In the chapter on Hegel, Finkelde shows that people are strongly influenced by structural forces and that a person cannot therefore "be a free being by herself" (11). Finkelde, however, opposes the idea put forward by Hegel, or at least a not unfamiliar reading of his work, that a person can become free by submitting herself to the social and ethical realm of a particular community. He argues that excessive subjectivity cannot be associated either with "the picture of Hegel as a totalitarian-minded theorist of the modern state" (11) or with the more modern readings of his work by, for example, Robert Brandom (1994), Axel Honneth (2014) and Robert Pippin (2008). Finkelde also discusses their work, which, he says, suggests that one becomes free by engaging in an "inferentialist network of direct or indirect standards of justification" (98). Hence, Finkelde maintains that change cannot take place according to the above-mentioned readings of Hegel.

What then makes change possible? Change occurs, for Finkelde, neither through Kantian "excessive subjects" nor through Hegelian subjectivity, that is, when one becomes aware of one's own position within a particular social and ethical realm and fulfills one's functions effectively within that particular realm. Nor does Finkelde think that change takes place through Brandom's, Honneth's and Pippin's ideas of engaging in inferentialist networks of giving and taking of reasons. Change happens, he says, because the unpredictable force of the unconsciousness -- the Real, in Lacanian terms -- breaks with structural conditions, which seemingly force persons to submit to them. In Finkelde's words:

excessive subjectivity appears as a formal logical structural moment in which particularity and universality, by equating form and content [here Finkelde draws on Hegel's work][3], decide from which dispositional viewpoint the subject (yet also a collective, a community of disciples, a church, a sect) looks at her life-world and thus provokes new judgments with unexpectable consequences (227).

In Finkelde's opinion, Lacan's theory shows that persons who are embedded in various kinds of inferentialist standards of justification can escape their embeddedness through the force of the Real. He believes that this has the potential "to stretch the existing virtualities across ever-new horizons of meaning and to always vitalize the body of politic anew" (154). Hence, the Real, which, Finkelde thinks, Hegel and Kant associate with the unruly forces of desire, excess or mania, becomes with Lacan instead what "breaks into the political space as the exposure of the limits of meaning through an insatiable desire" (158) and can lead to desirable change.

The power of the Real can, however, for Finkelde, not merely lead to such change; it can also become a destructive force causing pathologies and neuroses, not only within and among persons, but also within and among societies. This happens, he says, when subjects try to control the power of the Real through the supposed stability of the symbolic structure of language and culture -- the Big Other. The Real cannot, however, be controlled, according to Finkelde. It breaks through the Big Other and can do so constructively; and when that happens, it makes change not merely possible but also desirable.

How, then, is desirable change possible? Finkelde's original solution is that it is made possible through excessive subjectivity and its apostles. He argues that desirable change requires more than deeds associated with excessive subjectivity. It also demands an "authority that does not dissolve into immanence" (232), and a teaching that leads to something new, because of its "cognitive resistances and incommensurabilities" (232). Hence, it is the combination of deeds, personality and teaching that leads to something new and constructive, or so it seems. Finkelde's original resolution as to how desirable change comes about raises, however, some concerns.

First, it is surprising that Finkelde discusses women such as Rosa Parks and Antigone as representatives of excessive subjectivity, and men in relation to excessive subjectivity and its apostles.[4] He talks, for example, about men such as Sigmund Freud, Karl Marx, Jacques Lacan and Vladimir Lenin as "apostles", and about Martin Luther as being favorable in the context of apostles. Does this suggest that only women can be representatives of excessive subjectivity, and that only men can represent both excessive subjectivity and its apostles? What about Hannah Arendt, Grace Hopper, Hellen Keller, Ada Lovelace, Toni Morrison and Simone Weil? Do not they or other women whose personality and work highlighted something new and constructive count as representatives of excessive subjectivity and its apostles? It would have been of interest if Finkelde had addressed such issues with regard to his theory of excessive subjectivity.

Second, Finkelde could also have discussed whether the work of representatives of both excessive subjectivity and its apostles only brings about constructive change, or whether it can lead to destructive effects. This could have shed some light on the (possible) complexity of giving birth to desirable change. I think here of the work of Martin Luther, and in particular his book On the Jews and Their Lies (1971). The anti-Semitism expressed in this book and the use of its anti-Semitic views led to disastrous effects for Jews. Their books were burnt, their synagogues were destroyed and many of them badly treated and even killed because of the views expressed in that book. Finkelde could have discussed this tragic issue too, which shows that the work of the apostles of excessive subjectivity does not give birth only to desirable change for all concerned.

Third, Finkelde could have presented a more thorough discussion of Kant's work, in particular of his Metaphysics of Morals and Critique of the Power of Judgment. Such a discussion would probably show that Kant and Finkelde would not necessarily disagree. Kant distinguishes, for example, in his Metaphysics of Morals between perfect and imperfect duties. Perfect duties require specific actions while imperfect ones require the setting of an end, but there is latitude with regard to the actions one should take in relation to the imperfect duties of perfecting oneself and making the other happy. People can therefore perform different actions in relation to such duties. Thus, Finkelde can be said to be in agreement with Kant about the idea that one cannot know with certainty which actions to perform and that there is latitude when it comes to the actions to perform with regard to imperfect duties.

Finkelde also argues, as seen above, that change that leads to something new and constructive cannot be known immediately, and that this would be in opposition to Kant as well. This view does not necessarily disagree with Kant's views in his Critique of the Power of Judgment either. Kant argues here that the work of a genius is acknowledged when others recognize the originality and exemplarity of his/her work -- and this can obviously only happen afterwards and can take time; this others do when, inter alia, they engage in free play between imagination and understanding.[5] Here, too, Finkelde can be said to be in agreement with Kant, namely that the effects of the deeds of a genius can only be recognized retrospectively.

These concerns aside, Finkelde's book is a unique and vital contribution to an ongoing and important discussion of the central issues raised by the work of Kant, Hegel and Lacan; it is also of interest for philosophers and those interested in contemporary political theory and theology concerning freedom, subjectivity, excessive subjectivity, ethics, change, and what contributes to or brings about desired change.


Ameriks, K. (1985) Hegel's Critique of Kant's Theoretical Philosophy, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 46(1): 1-35.

Brandom, R. (1994) Making it Explicit: Reasoning, Representing, and Discursive Commitment, Harvard University Press.

Finkelde, D. (2017) Excessive Subjectivity -- Kant, Hegel, Lacan, and the Foundations of Ethics, Columbia University Press.

Guyer, P. (2006) The Harmony of the Faculties Revisited, in Rebecca Kukla (Ed.) Aesthetics and Cognition in Kant's Critical Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, pp. 162-193.

Guyer, P. (2017) Absolute idealism and the rejection of Kantian dualism, in Karl Ameriks (Ed.) The Cambridge Companion to German Idealism, Cambridge University Press, pp. 37-56.

Honneth, A. (2014) Freedom's Right: The Social Foundations of Democratic Life, translated by Joseph Ganahl, Polity.

Korsgaard, C. (1986) The right to lie: Kant on dealing with evil, Philosophy and Public Affairs, (15) 4: 325-349.

Korsgaard, C. (2008) The Constitution of Agency, Oxford University Press.

Korsgaard, C. (2009) Self-Constitution, Oxford University Press.

Luther, M. (1971) On the Jews and Their Lies, in Helmut T. Lehman (Ed.) Luther's Works, vol. 47, translated by Martin H. Bertram, Fortress Press.

Pippin, R. B. (2001) Rigorism and the 'New Kant', Kant und die Berliner Aufklärung. Akten des IX Internationalen Kant Kongressen, Bd. 1: 313-326.

Pippin, R. B. (2008) Hegel's Practical Philosophy: Rational Agency as Ethical Life, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Zupančič, A. (2000) Ethics of the Real: Kant and Lacan, Verso.

[1] See Korsgaard (2008) and (2009), in which she argues that one has a duty to render oneself efficacious and autonomous, but that there is a latitude regarding which actions to perform in order to do so. This suggests that Korsgaard’s views are consistent with Finkelde’s in the sense that one cannot know exactly what to do in each and every single situation, which, however, does not mean that one does not have a duty to render oneself efficacious and autonomous or enable others to do so. On the contrary, one has a duty to do to both, according to Korsgaard.

[2] See Zupančič (2000).

[3] See Guyer (2017) for a critical discussion of Hegel’s critique of Kant; see also Ameriks (1985) for a critical discussion of Hegel’s critique of Kant’s theoretical philosophy, and Pippin (2001) for a critique of Kant’s supposed rigorism; see also Korsgaard (1986) for a critical discussion of this critique of Kant’s views.

[4] Finkelde goes beyond the traditional Christian view of the twelve Apostles when he develops his ideas concerning excessive subjectivity and apostles. 

[5] See, for example, Guyer (2006) for a discussion of the different ways in which the free play of imagination of understanding can be understood, namely the precognitive, multicognitive and metacognitive approaches. Guyer argues against the first two, and for the last one.