Excursions with Thoreau: Philosophy, Poetry, Religion

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Edward F. Mooney, Excursions with Thoreau: Philosophy, Poetry, Religion, Bloomsbury, 2015, 274pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781501305641.

Reviewed by Stanley Bates, Middlebury College


This is, from my point of view, a delightful book. It consists of 15 chapters, 12 of which are "heavily revised" versions of previously published essays, and three brief closing sections. It is addressed to those who are at least somewhat familiar with the work of Thoreau, and who will take seriously the idea that his work is relevant to philosophy. The philosopher who is most responsible for the existence of such readers is, of course, Stanley Cavell, and Cavell is a continuing background to, and inspiration for, Edward F. Mooney's work. However, his focus is somewhat different. Cavell concentrated on Walden in his The Senses of Walden, because he found it to have been dramatically underread. Mooney refers to, and occasionally quotes from, Walden, but he attempts to cultivate a more intimate relationship with Thoreau, and to understand Thoreau's own way of life, or, perhaps better, the phenomenology of Thoreau's being-in-the-world, against the background of Thoreau's commitment to the idea of philosophy as a way of life. Mooney, therefore, draws more on A Week on the Concord and Merrimack Rivers, and on Thoreau's essays, journals and letters, as well as Walden. In all of these writings, Thoreau's personality (or, perhaps, persona) is self-consciously to the fore. Thoreau is not however intentionally providing an autobiography, and a reader of Mooney's book would be helped by some familiarity with Thoreau's biography. Because Mooney's book collects, and revises, essays, he does not attempt to provide a full biographical and historical account of Thoreau's life.

Mooney is not just interested in explicating Thoreau. The title, Excursions with Thoreau, is meant more seriously. The essays attempt not only to show us Thoreau's way of living, (or, what I called above, his being-in-the-world) but, to some degree, to initiate Mooney himself, and his readers, into that way of life. He wants his readers to see what he sees in Thoreau's writing, and to be affected by it in the way Mooney himself has been. Of course, this fits exactly with the tradition of "philosophy as a way of life" that Thoreau both preaches and exemplifies. Thoreau in the works discussed, not only provides a number of descriptions of his encounters with the natural world including his human encounters; he also provides a kind of phenomenology of the moods that these encounters evoke. Mooney masterfully characterizes the complexity (and sometimes contradiction) that structure these ways of being in the world. Thoreau gives accounts of the beauty and terror of natural scenes, of the celebration and the mourning that are part of our existence. He is both happy in the world, and so revolted by the reality of slavery that the world can seem utterly disgusting (though that mood is redeemed in the text by an encounter with a flower).

What may be the biggest problem of the structure of this book may also be its greatest strength. As I wrote above, the chapters are revisions of earlier papers written on different occasions for different journals and books. This means that not only are the major themes of the author's reading of Thoreau present in most of the essays, but even the same passages and quotations are visited pretty frequently. One is reminded of Wittgenstein's remark, in the preface to the Philosophical Investigations, in which he compares his (lack of) method to "sketches of landscapes." He continues, "The same or almost the same points were always being approached afresh from different directions, and new sketches made." If one reads the book from start to finish, one is struck by this sense of seeing the same issues from different points of view. Some of the events of Thoreau's life have a particularly central role in influencing Mooney's reading of him. The death of his brother John, and the death of Waldo Emerson, which occurred near in time, were shattering instances of human mortality for Thoreau. His attempt to recover something of the remains of Margaret Fuller after her drowning, and his description of that attempt, seem revelatory to Mooney. Thoreau's experience of desolation at the top of Mount Katahdin is a crucial moment that Mooney cites in considering the complexity of Thoreau's account of his response to the world. The combination of mourning and celebration in his writing are understood relative to those events. In these cases, Thoreau's writing about the events demands serious interpretive study, and Mooney provides close readings of his carefully constructed sentences.

Another central occurrence in Thoreau's life was his meeting with John Brown. Thoreau wrote about Brown's capture at Harper's Ferry and his subsequent hanging in two lectures/essays. Brown's character is, of course, one of the most contested topics in American history. He is often, now, portrayed as a murderous fanatic. Thoreau would have none of that. It is useful to be reminded that abolitionists like Thoreau and Emerson could regard the United States constitution as a contract with absolute evil. They regarded the great constitutional compromise on slavery as what we would now call a crime against humanity. Were they wrong? Surely not. Until the abolition of slavery during and after the Civil War, the United States permitted one of the most radically unjust systems in human history -- racially-based chattel slavery. Mooney explicates Thoreau's understanding of Brown beautifully -- most memorably his claim that Brown had not died at his hanging. Thoreau, of course, wrote strikingly on the limits of our duty to the state. Indeed, this may have been his most influential writing because of its impact on Gandhi, and Martin Luther King Jr.. Thoreau is often mocked because of his willingness to spend one night in jail (until Emerson got him out) as though this limited punishment undercuts his account of the limits of political obligation. Mooney will have none of such mockery.

I'll briefly comment on one more aspect of Mooney's reading of Thoreau. This like several other themes runs through several essays. He interprets Thoreau as a thinker who is, in a broad sense, a part of Romanticism. (This is no surprise since American Transcendentalism is usually thought of as a part of the broad current of Romanticism.) This bears on the relationship of Romanticism to modern science. The great Romantic thinkers are often thought of as hostile to science. (This is, in fact, false. Richard Holmes has written a marvelous book about Romanticism and science.[1]) However, what was being resisted was a kind of scientism that had been erected on the foundation of an 18th century materialism (derived from ancient atomism) and the overpowering example of Newtonian physics. This scientism was held to entail what has been called the disenchantment of the world. The central theme of Romanticism, in philosophy and poetry, is a refusal of this disenchantment.[2] Mooney sees Thoreau with his commitment to the observation of the natural world as both grounded in science, and as resisting scientism. This seems fair to me. Moreover, Mooney in several passages, particularly in the essay "Grounding Poetry" relates this to current debates and concerns about the value of the humanities in the university curriculum. He argues that it is a stunted conception of knowledge that would deny the reality of what Thoreau calls "Sympathy with Intelligence." Mooney goes on, "Our highest most fulfilling attunement to the world comes when we are alert for local 'Intelligence,' as radiant things give radiant news of love, dread, grief, or delight -- from this alder or that rock, or from this grand vista."[3] Mooney is clear that Thoreau does not hold the view (which he calls hyper-Romantic) that science somehow kills poetry or is incompatible with it -- but science (or scientific knowing) is not our basic way of being-in-the-world. This account of Thoreau runs through all of Mooney's readings and, one hopes, might bring his readers back to Thoreau's writings. I'll let Mooney have the final word here on the kind of writing that he finds in Thoreau.

The writing articulates life at once philosophical, religious, literary-poetic. It is a life of walking, seeing, tasting, hearing in imagination-drenched immersions. We sense a way of taking up with the world and of being happy to be of it. Yet seeking life and serenity can miserably fail. Will the emphasis fall on despair or exaltation, on confidence or self-doubt, on loss or return? Reality is difficult and gives us reasons for both . . . Thoreau is startled into life and delight and invites us along.[4]

[1] Richard Holmes, The Age of Wonder: The Romantic Generation and the Discovery of the Wonder and Terror of Science. (Pantheon Books, 2008)

[2] For elaboration, see Stanley Bates, "Refusing Disenchantment: Romanticism, Criticism, Philosophy, Philosophy and Literature, (Vol. 40, No. 2, October 2016)

[3] Mooney, p. 220

[4] ibid., p. 198