Exemplarist Moral Theory

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Linda Trinkaus Zagzebski, Exemplarist Moral Theory, Oxford University Press, 2017, 274pp., $69.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190655846.

Reviewed by Noell Birondo, Wichita State University


Linda Trinkaus Zagzebski believes that a comprehensive moral theory can be constructed by identifying moral exemplars and by investigating (to put it very roughly) what it is that makes them tick. We identify moral exemplars by direct reference to persons we admire "upon reflection." Moral exemplars are persons like that. Two emotions will play a central role in this type of moral theory: admiration, and its opposite, contempt. Zagzebski's theory proceeds by rough analogy with a physical theory that identifies instances of water and then goes on to investigate the physical make-up of the natural kind, water. But an even better comparison, as she says, is to a community of linguistic users which identifies various instances of tigers, say, and then goes on to investigate the (possibly evolving) referent of the species-term "tiger." Zagzebski provides an engaging, illuminating, and deeply human discussion of how the details of this exemplarist approach, with its investigation into the psychological make up of moral exemplars, might be developed.

The book is in eight chapters and the argument builds by degrees. The three earliest chapters set the stage for the theory proper, deployed in chapters 4-7. The final chapter, by far the most arid, is "Exemplarist Semantics and Meta-Ethics," which includes a discussion of, e.g., moral terms and the necessary a priori.

The initial chapter provides an overview of the project and will be familiar to some readers, since it earlier appeared in a well-regarded collection on moral and epistemic virtue.[1] Chapter two draws on empirical and other sources, including Kierkegaard and Nietzsche, to discuss the nature of admiration and its trustworthiness. The chapter includes some brilliant observations on the development of resentment for what is admirable: "a general cynicism about the admirable that leads to a reluctance to admire anybody" (45). In a generally optimistic book, this discussion of moral psychology gone sour is refreshingly biting. The third chapter introduces Zagzebski's portraits of three historical moral exemplars; it also displays her helpfully balanced, multi-layered methodology for learning about them. This includes first-personal testimony, second-personal familiarity, including biographies and other narrative accounts, and third-personal observation, especially psychological studies of exemplars.

The substantive ethical theory comes, as I said, in the four central chapters. The topics of these four chapters are: virtue and other aretaic notions, emulation of exemplars and moral reasons, the good life (on the relation of the admirable life to the desirable life), and deontic notions and their importance. Here is a tiny sampling of how the theory works. In the realm of the aretaic, Zagzebski provides the following account of virtue:

A virtue is a deep and enduring acquired trait that we admire upon reflection, consisting of a disposition to have a certain emotion that initiates and directs action towards an end, and reliable success in reaching that end. (113)

She immediately adds, though, that this account can be "revised after investigation." By that she means that it can be revised after empirical investigation -- investigation into what we admire "upon reflection." (More on that notion below.) In the realm of the deontic, Zagzebski makes direct appeal to moral exemplars, giving this definition of duty:

A duty in some set of circumstances C is an act that persons with phronesis (persons like that) would judge to be the only option in C. It is an act such that if they did not do it, they would feel guilty, and they would blame others if others did not do it. (196)

Among other qualifications and clarifications of such deontic definitions, Zagzebski says explicitly that she is not offering any kind of non-cognitivist analysis. "The existence of wrong acts and moral duties," she says, "does not depend on the existence of exemplars of practical wisdom" (196 -- 97).

Given that snapshot of the current project, readers who are familiar with Zagzebski's earlier book, Divine Motivation Theory (Cambridge University Press, 2004), will naturally wonder how her discussion in this book (EMT) differs from, or what it adds to, the defense of moral exemplarism provided in the earlier book. It seems to me that there are two major differences. The first is that the version of moral exemplarism defended in EMT aims to be consistent with a thoroughgoing philosophical naturalism (167) -- after all, she says, we live in naturalistic times -- whereas the earlier book defends a version of exemplarism that, in its unrestricted form, emphatically does not share that aim. In the unrestricted form in the earlier book, the Incarnation of Jesus Christ serves as the bridge that allows human beings to emulate God, the supreme moral exemplar. The discussion in EMT is much more ecumenical, since it leaves out any transcendental backing, and the book may therefore appeal to a wider audience. Indeed, in apparent contrast to her earlier discussion of exemplarism, Zagzebski says that: "An exemplar with a radically different psychic structure would be unrecognizable" (138).[2]

The second major difference is that EMT draws extensively on contemporary empirical psychology in order to investigate the various motivations, emotions, reasons, beliefs, etc., of those persons we admire upon reflection, the moral exemplars. Indeed, the book strains to testify to its own empirical adequacy. There is a fair amount of empirical evidence along with Zagzebski's repeated insistence (for whose benefit is far from clear) that the various claims defended in the book are empirically testable. This quest for empirical respectability, familiar by now in certain areas of moral philosophy, is at times illuminating and at other times distracting. Having said that, I would like to emphasize that Zagzebski's overall discussion here strikes me as one of the best I have seen in balancing philosophical theory, experimental evidence, and various forms of literary and biographical narratives of moral exemplars.

Moral exemplars provide the foundation of the theory. That is, individuals, not concepts, provide the foundation of the theory. Zagzebski takes this non-conceptual foundation to be "the greatest advantage" of her theory over its rivals, especially when it comes to providing an account of virtue (128).[3] She provides three extended discussions of historical exemplars. The selection of these three exemplars might at first seem like an odd mix: The first two are twentieth-century Roman Catholic Europeans and the third one is Confucius. But the selection is not meant to be representative of the class of world-historical moral exemplars. The three men represent three types of exemplars: the hero, the saint, and the sage. Each exemplifies a virtue that for him is dominant, although they, of course, have other virtues as well. The hero exemplifies courage, the saint exemplifies Christian charity (caritas, agapĂȘ), and the sage exemplifies wisdom. I will focus here on Zagzebski's example of the hero, as a way of saying something below about what admiration "upon reflection" amounts to.

Leopold Socha was a sewer inspector and former thief who helped some of his fellow Poles escape the early deaths that were threatened by the Nazi occupation. Socha helped them hide in the city's sewers for months, providing them with food and other necessities, and risking his own life. Many of them survived. In this episode in his life, Socha seems to have shown great courage. But there are also a few mitigating factors. First, Socha helped at the beginning only because they paid him to do so, otherwise he would not have done so. Second, he apparently thought his helping behavior would redeem his past sins, an ulterior motive. And third, he is reported to have proclaimed proudly to bystanders, once the survivors emerged from the sewers, "These are my Jews."

Zagzebski says that Leopold Socha is a moral exemplar. She thinks that we will find him admirable "upon reflection," at least along the dimension regarding courage. But even that admiration will be tempered, for some of us, by moral concern. One might also wonder about seemingly courageous people with considerably less admirable ends -- about the 9/11 attackers, for instance, or Japanese kamikaze pilots, or Harry Truman. Were they also heroes? To whom? Zagzebski advances a nuanced position in response to one of the issues involved here, pointing out that, according to recent studies, a person's admiration will differ depending on whether that person assesses the end of action from his or her own point of view, or from the point of view of the person whose action it is (115). But there is also a harder question here, about cross-cultural disagreements over admirability. In those cases, Zagzebski's position had better not entail, as it can sometimes certainly seem, that what settles the question is some kind of cosmic Gallup poll.

On her official view, as I have indicated, what settles such questions will be what 'we' admire "upon reflection." But what does she mean by "reflection" or "self-reflection"? Zagzebski answers this question by helpfully observing that:

The best we can do to be confident an emotion is fitting is the same as the best we can do to be confident that a belief is true: we find that it survives reflection over time on our total set of psychic states when we are using them the best we can to make them fit their objects. That is what I mean by conscientious self-reflection. (45)

That response strikes me as, in general, exactly right. But I wonder whether Zagzebski also has something stronger in mind. In a number of places she appeals (apparently approvingly) to the developing "moral sense" of a child (129 n., 154) and to the idea "that humans have an innate moral sense" (135 n., 129).

Zagzebski insists that her project remains quite distinct from any version of Aristotelian eudaimonism, although certain aspects of her view may be consistent with it, or even overlap with it. But it depends on how eudaimonism is understood. Unfortunately, Zagzebski considers only one of two possibilities for Aristotelian eudaimonism, even though contemporary Aristotelians go in two fairly opposed directions on this point. This is what she says about the relationship of her general approach to Aristotle's:

In constructing a theory in which the admirable is more basic than the desirable, I am reversing the priority Aristotle gives in the Nicomachean Ethics. There he defines the good as the desirable -- what everyone desires for its own sake (NE 1094a18 -- 20), and he identifies that with eudaimonia, a life of well-being or flourishing. (31 -- 32)

Since Aristotle clearly thinks that virtue is admirable or praiseworthy, Zagzebski is able to say that for Aristotle "the good in the sense of the desirable is basic, and the good in the sense of the admirable is derivative" (32). But this is only because, on Zagzebski's view, eudaimonia is constituted by "the things we naturally desire in life" (165). Hence on her view eudaimonia will be recognizable as such independently of the virtuous person's outlook (despite Aristotle's indications to the contrary) and virtue will be "derivative" from it, for instance by providing the means to it or by being constituents of it. On Zagzebski's understanding, Aristotle's project amounts to what I have elsewhere characterized as an 'external' validation of the virtues, and I agree with the many contemporary Aristotelian commentators who think that no such project can be correct, neither as a philosophical project in its own right, nor as an interpretation of Aristotle.[4] In fact an 'internal' approach to Aristotelian eudaimonism will look a lot like Zagzebski's own proposal on this issue:

When I say that it is good for a person to be virtuous, I do not mean that virtue benefits a person in the sense that virtue is a means to other elements of a good life, although that may be true also. Virtue is an element of a desirable life because virtue is admirable, and it is desirable to be admirable. (182)

There is nothing in this summary of Zagzebski's view on the relationship between the admirable and the desirable with which Aristotelian eudaimonism, understood in its most plausible form, needs to disagree.[5]

It is bewildering that Zagzebski explicitly debars herself from any sustained discussion of contemptible persons. She says that as a general matter, "I am not comfortable naming names of contemptible persons" (47). She makes that remark just before making a special exception in the case of Hitler, whom she considers to be a "safe bet" when it comes to the category of the contemptible. But why wouldn't there be many safe bets? Given Zagzebski's theory, and its appeal to our reflective abilities, it seems to me that identifying contemptible persons (she calls them 'anti-exemplars') should be as uncontroversial as "naming names" of admirable persons. Such 'anti-exemplars' are persons we find contemptible upon reflection. Anti-exemplars are persons like that. If Zagzebski's theory is correct, such claims should be as uncontroversial as they are in the case of exemplars: Such persons are, after all, those whom we find contemptible upon reflection. My suspicion is that Zagzebski's discomfort here traces back to worries (perhaps latent, and certainly deep) about her response to cross-cultural disagreements over admirability. This question concerns the very first step in Zagzebski's theory, about identifying moral exemplars. The question deserves much more attention than I can give it here -- but it is also quite sure to receive it, given the highly original moral theory that Zagzebski delivers in this engaging and insightful book.

But it is also true that Zagzebski can be almost excessively uncritical of the evaluative views of others. At one point, for instance, she describes what the "good life" can often mean to well-traveled and well-fed university professors like ourselves, and she claims that, "We pity those people who have not read Plato or listened to Beethoven, and whose lives mostly involve manual labor" (171). But, in that case, aren't we wrong to pity the many hard working people who fit that description, the many generations of fishers, farmers, and so on? "I would not say we are wrong," Zagzebski says, "but surely the kind of 'good life' I have described is optional" (171).[6]

That response, coming fairly late in the book, caught me by surprise. Because if that is what we university professors think about the hard-working people who fit Zagzebski's description, then I would say, not only that our conception of the good life is optional, but that we, and especially our pity, are fairly well contemptible. Perhaps it is just difficult for me to see how an exemplarist moral theory can benefit from declining to highlight the many ways in which we fall short in our ethical lives, by continuing to emulate those who are, in fact, contemptible. Moral exemplars no doubt command a lively appreciation of the contemptible, and that appreciation, as depressing as it can no doubt be, is something that can sustain us against the dangers of false heroes, and false prophets, and lesser, but equally false moral beacons of all kinds.


Thanks are due to Thomas L. Carson for his extremely helpful written comments on an earlier draft of this review, and also to David E. Soles for his valuable feedback.

[1] Virtue and Vice, Moral and Epistemic, ed. Heather Battaly (Wiley-Blackwell, 2010).

[2] Some reviewers of Divine Motivation Theory pointed out that it is not clear that God can serve as an exemplar for human beings, and that it is anyway controversial whether God has any emotions, which are the psychic elements that we would need to emulate in order to motivate virtuous actions. See Thomas L. Carson's review in Mind 116 (2007) 254-57; and Christopher Toner's in the Review of Metaphysics 64:1 (2010) 171-74.

[3] That comment gives a sense of how Zagzebski can sometimes overstate the putative advantages of her approach over competing theories, since (e.g.) Martha Nussbaum interprets the Aristotelian approach to ethical investigation precisely by appeal to an externalist theory of language of the type deployed by Zagzebski. See section III of Martha C. Nussbaum, "Non-Relative Virtues: An Aristotelian Approach," Midwest Studies In Philosophy 13 (1988) 32-53. Moral philosophers sympathetic to John Stuart Mill will also be surprised to see the assessment (apparently Zagzebski's own) that Mill "ignores virtue" (21).

[4] For further discussion of these points about Aristotelian eudaimonism, see my "Virtue and Prejudice: Giving and Taking Reasons," The Monist 99 (2016) 212-23; the article also appears in a mildly revised and expanded version in Virtue's Reasons: New Essays on Virtue, Character, and Reasons (Routledge, 2017), ed. Noell Birondo and S. Stewart Braun, 189-202. See also T. H. Irwin, "Nil Admirari? Uses and Abuses of Admiration," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, Supplementary Volume 89:1 (2015) 223-48, on admiration in Aristotle and other moral philosophers, and in response to an earlier version of Zagzebski's EMT ch. 2.

[5] I disagree for similar reasons with Patrick M. Clark's view that exemplarism fares better than Aristotelian eudaimonism when considering the motivations of a virtuous agent facing death. See Clark's discussion of Zagzebski's earlier work on exemplarism in his Perfection in Death: The Christological Dimensions of Courage in Aquinas (The Catholic University of American Press, 2015), ch. 6. On the eudaimonist side, see John McDowell's remarks on courage in his insufficiently discussed paper, "Eudaimonism and Realism in Aristotle's Ethics," in The Engaged Intellect: Philosophical Essays (Harvard University Press, 2009), 23 -40; originally published in Aristotle and Moral Realism, ed. Robert Heinaman (Westview Press, 1995), 201-18.

[6] Zagzebski makes it quite clear that she does not herself think that such traditional lifestyles are pitiful; but the question in play here is about the appropriate ethical response to the familiar type of elitism that she describes.