Exemplars of Truth

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Keith Lehrer, Exemplars of Truth, Oxford University Press, 2019, 155pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190884277.

Reviewed by Ted Poston, University of Alabama


Keith Lehrer has been defending a coherentist account of knowledge for close to half a century. His book Knowledge (1974) articulates a careful and sophisticated account of knowledge according to which knowledge requires answering every objection to a claim from a background system of beliefs that doesn't rely on error. Over the years Lehrer has modified his account of knowledge in response to various criticisms. In this, his latest book, he continues to defend a broadly coherentist account of knowledge with some surprising changes to his earlier view.

The most significant departure from his earlier view is that he now explicitly allows for justification by way of experience and in a way that provides a guarantee of truth. This is intended to answer the objection to coherentist views that, while coherence may be necessary for complete justification, it is not sufficient. A coherent body of beliefs may be out of touch with reality. What is needed to answer this objection is a truth-connection. A foundationalist account is well-positioned to reply that experience supplies that relation. Lehrer now concurs. He argues for an account of experience that can provide a truth-connection. His account centers on the notion of exemplar representation which involves taking a token experience as representative of an experience type. For instance, one's token experience of a red tomato can be taken as a characterization of the experience type red. Lehrer's aim with exemplar representation is to provide a truth-connection so that a coherent body of beliefs joined with exemplarized experiences provides a guarantee of truth. In the following I offer a brief summary of each chapter and then raise a few questions about Lehrer's revised view.

The initial chapter, "Defensible Knowledge and Exemplars Representation," tracks through the history of twentieth century epistemology with emphasis on Lehrer's contributions. He explains how his theory of knowledge responded to the developments of fallibilism, the Gettier problem, and the inadequacies of reliabilism. From fallibilism, the idea that the evidential basis of what you know is compatible with the falsity of what is believed, Lehrer drew the conclusion that knowledge was relative to a background system. He doesn't spell out his inference here but the idea may be that, because there is a logical gap between what is known and the basis for what is known, there must be a system of beliefs that, in some sense or other, makes that transition acceptable. From Gettier, the idea that fallibilism interacts poorly with inferences from the basis for what is known, Lehrer draws the conclusion that the background system has to be purged of errors so that any inference from that basis doesn't essentially rely on something that is false. Finally, a third motivation for Lehrer's account of knowledge is Sellars's remark that reliable belief formation isn't sufficient for knowledge because it neglects the justification game in human knowledge. These three elements yield Lehrer's initial account of knowledge as the complete justification of a truly believed claim from a person's set of beliefs purged of error.

A central problem for Lehrer's account of knowledge is that a complete justification from a person's corrected beliefs may still be out of touch with reality (p. 21). The solution, Lehrer claims, lies in a special role for experience in which a particular experience is taken to be an exemplar for a class of experiences. The thought appears to be that a token experience can be used in a way to fix the meaning for a class of experiences. A novel experience, say of the smell of rotten fruit, can be taken as an exemplar of experience type. Then the judgement 'This [token experience] is that [class of experiences]' has a truth guarantee. Lehrer thinks this general account can be extended to provide justification for about objects in the external world. The task of the rest of the book is to clarify this picture.

In chapter 2, "Perceptual Knowledge of the External World," Lehrer addresses the justification and defense of perceptual knowledge claims. He explains his views by returning often to the case of Dante (pp. 30-31 and pp. 54-58). Lehrer describes Dante, who first encounters a strange smell during a walk in the woods. Dante doesn't know anything about skunks but he does know that this token olfactory sensation is unpleasant. Moreover, Lehrer alleges, Dante knows that this token sensation is of an external odor. Dante's hiking companion informs him that this smell is of a skunk and thus Dante comes to know that there's a skunk nearby.

Dante's conceptions of (i) the experience type (malodorous experience), (ii) the external odor (skunk spray), and (iii) the animal (skunk) are all informed by the token experience. According to Lehrer the token experience becomes part of the meaning of and evidence for claims corresponding to (i)-(iii). With respect to (i), the token experience is taken to exhibit the qualitative nature of the experience type. The judgment 'This is thus', where 'this' refers to the experience token and 'thus' refers to the experience type, has a truth-guarantee by way of the fact that the experience token is used to characterize the nature of the experience type. Similarly, Lehrer claims that the meaning of both the external quality and the external object are partially constituted by the experience token without being reducible to such experiences (cf. pp. 27 and 55). Dante can know that there is a skunk in the vicinity on the basis of such experience combined with a background system that enables him to answer each objection to that claim.

Chapter 3, "Knowledge, Autonomy, and Exemplars," is a relatively short chapter that brings into the discussion Lehrer's views on the role of autonomy and preference in epistemology (See Lehrer 1997) and then connects it with exemplar representation. Lehrer's epistemology is built around a self-trust principle that "I am worthy of my trust in what I accept and prefer to accept in the pursuit of reason" (p. 61). This principle is the keystone that supports other judgements and is supported by those judgments. Self-trust and preference manifest in exemplar representation; the individual chooses to take a token experience as exhibiting what an experience class is like (pp. 70-73). This part of Lehrer's view suggests both a Cartesian epistemology of an isolated individual constructing his or her own worldview and a Humpty-Dumpty theory of meaning on which an individual chooses facts about meanings. Lehrer has a response to these worries. In earlier work he invokes the distinction between primitive knowledge and discursive knowledge (Lehrer 2000). Primitive knowledge is a matter of accurate, reliable representation. Discursive knowledge is undefeated, irrefutable justified belief. Similarly, there is a level of meaning that is sub-personal -- Lehrer approvingly cites Fodor on this point. Lehrer's views about the role of self-trust and preference are formed with respect to discursive knowledge. His key claim is that discursive human knowledge involves an autonomous commitment. One is reminded of Chisholm's suggestive remark:

We hope . . . that our marks of evidence will also be marks of truth. We hope that, if there is some general mark of evidence, a certain type of state M which is a mark of evidence for a certain type of hypothesis H, then M will be a reliable criterion of truth; we hope that, more often than not, when we believe H while we are in state M, we will believe H truly. (Chisholm 1957, p. 38)

Lehrer's view seems to replace Chisholm's hope with self-trust. Instead of 'we hope', Lehrer has 'I trust'. There is a fundamental trust that one's marks of evidence are indeed truth-indicative.

In chapter 4, "Exemplars, Truth, and Scientific Revolution," Lehrer explains how "exemplar representation provides the empirical connection to undefeated and irrefutable defensibility" (p. 84). This idea is one that he appealed to earlier: exemplar representation partially constitutes what it is like for us to experience external objects. The exemplars then become the inferential basis for the existence of objects and properties in the world (p. 90). Together with a background system purged of error, these exemplar experiences allow us to meet the conditions for Lehrer's account of knowledge. There are details to his view that I gloss over but the main thrust of the view is that experiences together with background information provide the inferential basis for knowledge of the external world. One puzzling aspect of Lehrer's view is how it handles skeptical scenarios. Consider the objection to Dante's taking the token experience of the malodorous sensation to exhibit an experience-type of an external quality. The objection is that there is no such external quality; rather the token sensation is a modification of Dante's internal state with no such external cause. About this objection Lehrer writes, "The objection that sensation is such a deceptive result is one that may be met in terms of our background system. In that system we autonomously prefer accepting that the sensation is externally caused to the hypothesis . . . that the sensation is the result of olfactory abnormality" (p. 92). This is a curious way to answer a skeptical challenge. While it may be true that we prefer that sensations have external causes, preferences do not provide reasons that sensations have external causes. A different way to answer that skeptical challenge would be to appeal to either simplicity or conservativeness. But Lehrer (1974) did not prefer that route. Even so, an appeal to simplicity or conservativeness has the virtue of fit with scientific practice.

Lehrer's task in chapter 5, "Intuitions and Coherence in the Keystone Loop," is to explain how his account brings together the historical and contemporary controversy over "whether knowledge and justification are a matter of isolated intuition or coherence with a background system" (p. 108). He suggests the resolution to this controversy requires distinguishing between primitive knowledge based on isolated intuition and defensible knowledge based on coherence with a background system. These types of knowledge are brought together by a self-referential loop (p. 109). The thought appears to be that primitive knowledge yields knowledge of the character of some sensations and, by exemplarization, that knowledge is taken to characterize a class of sensations which together with background information is used to secure knowledge of the external world. Lehrer finds support for this keystone epistemology in Thomas Reid's remarks on first principles. On his reading, Reid stresses both that intuition of the first principles is the foundation for knowledge and that the first principles depend on each other for their reasonableness. Lehrer's application of this view is that the self-trust principle is the keystone to knowledge; it supports and is supported by coherence in a background system.

So much for summary. Lehrer's view is carefully articulated. There are details and nuances that this short review cannot delve into. The book is a significant contribution to contemporary epistemology. The conflicting pressures on an account of knowledge are difficult to balance. Knowledge rests on a foundation and knowledge depends for its acceptability on coherence with background information. Coherence must be more than a pretty story; it must involve the world. Lehrer's attempt to explain the way coherence involves the world centers on the abstruse notion of exemplar representation. Throughout the book, he returns again and again to develop this notion. My understanding of exemplar representation is the following: a person who has a token experience of an experiential quality F can take that token experience to stand for, by way of definition, an experience type F. When Dante has the token experience of a malodorous sensation he takes that token experience to characterize an experience type malodorous sensation. This definitional move can be extended to characterize what an experience of an external quality or object is like.

Here are two worries for this account. First, the knowledge of sensory experience that Lehrer assumes is an appeal to the myth of the given. Lehrer assumes that Dante knows what the sensation in itself is like. This knowledge may be nothing more than the mere indexical thought that 'this sensation is like this [whatever this is]'. Or the knowledge may be more substantive: 'this sensation is like thus [a stable experiential character experienced by many subjects across times]'. If the former, then sensory knowledge is too trivial to play a substantive epistemological role. If the latter, then it's mysterious how one can have this knowledge apart from lots of other knowledge. How can one know by way of isolated experience that this token experience is a member of an experiential type that occurs in oneself and others on multiple occasions?[1] Lehrer's general epistemological view would seem sympathetic to this worry. One solution is to move to a non-doxastic form of coherentism in which the background system includes both beliefs and experiences. Experience does not provide foundational knowledge but experience is required for empirical knowledge.

The second worry about Lehrer's account of exemplar representation centers around its scope. Let's grant that some experiences can be exemplarized so that a token experience comes to characterize an experience type. Does this exemplarization process apply to all or most of sensory knowledge? Is it the case that the meaning of 'doorknob' and the justification we have for believing claims about doorknobs depends on an individual first having a token experience and then exemplarizing that experience to stand for a class of experiences? Lehrer is inclined at this point to follow Fodor's account of representation (see pp. 129-30). Representational content is automatic and innate. But on Lehrer's view, at a later more sophisticated stage we come to reflect on our reasons for believing the things we do and it is at this stage that exemplar representation comes into play. We come to take token experiences as standing for experiential types. There is much one could say about this, but there are two concerns: (i) it's unclear what dialectical advantage such a view has over an older explanatory coherentism that takes one's pre-reflective beliefs and experiences as constraints on inferences to the best explanation, and (ii) the exemplarization move seems to change the relevant content of automatic and innate beliefs. Prior to exemplarization, beliefs about doorknobs are about doorknobs; but after exemplarization, beliefs about doorknobs are about an object that typically causes a certain experience type. One way to make this later concern precise would be to consider how Lehrer's exemplarization move handles Fodor's disjunction problem (See Fodor 1984). I lack space to develop this here but the concern is that the non-skeptical advantages of the exemplarization of experience trade on changing the content of perceptual beliefs in such a way that beliefs in radical skeptical scenarios are not false.

These concerns aside, Lehrer's book is an excellent contribution to contemporary epistemology. It is a detailed reflection on a central divide for theories of knowledge. It is well-worth working through this latest of Lehrer's superb contributions to epistemology.


Chisholm, R. 1957. Perceiving, Binghamton, NY: Cornell University Press.

Fodor, J. 1984. "Semantics, Wisconsin Style." Synthese. 59: 231-250.

Lehrer, K. 2011. Art, Self and Knowledge. Oxford University Press.

Lehrer, K. 1974. Knowledge. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Lehrer, K. 1997. Self-Trust: A Study of Reason, Knowledge, and Autonomy. New York: Oxford University Press.

Lehrer, K. 2000. Theory of Knowledge. 2nd ed. Boulder, CO: Westview Press.

Poston, T. 2014. Reason and Explanation: A Defense of Explanatory Coherentism. Basingstoke, UK: Palgrave Macmillan.

[1] See Poston (2014) Ch. 5 for a detailed development of this argument.