Existential Dependence and Cognate Notions

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Fabrice Correia, Existential Dependence and Cognate Notions, Philosophia Verlag, 2005, 171pp., $89.74 (hbk), ISBN 3884050885.

Reviewed by David Manley, University of Southern California


This volume is a skillful exploration of various notions of existential dependence, with an emphasis on their logical properties. A book-length project of this sort was long overdue, and Fabrice Correia's solid work will be a useful point of reference for anyone working in metaphysics.

Actually, the subject matter has implications well beyond metaphysics, because it's not just in metaphysics that philosophers assert, for example, that a (e.g. a mental state, a creature, a set) depends for its existence on b (a brain state, a creator, a member). Nor is it only in metaphysics that certain facts are said to hold in virtue of other facts. Often nothing is said about the nature of the relations that are being invoked in such contexts, even when they are clearly supposed to be doing a good deal of work. Characterizing such relations is an important task, and one that Correia undertakes with admirable clarity.

I'll begin with a sketch of each chapter, and follow up with some concerns about Correia's methodology.

Chapter 1 presents a logical system for expressing the notions of modality, essence, and existence, to be employed throughout the book. There is an especially helpful discussion of a logic for essence, and arguments for six logical principles about essence. (Here as elsewhere there is an acknowledged debt to Kit Fine's masterly work on essence and existential dependence.) Correia also defines certain terms that are important for subsequent discussion, such as 'identity-dependence'. But readers wishing to skip a thorough characterization of the logical system to be used in the rest of the book -- one that does not leave out even a formal statement that modus ponens is among its rules -- such readers can skim Chapter 1 for starters and use it as a reference later if a crucial point of logic or an unfamiliar term impedes their progress.

In the second chapter, Correia discusses and rejects some accounts of 'simple dependence', the most central type of existential dependence. This is the notion at work when philosophers say such things as: 'in order to exist, a needs b to exist'. Here are some claims that Correia takes to be paradigmatically about simple dependence: 'in order to exist, an event needs its participant(s) to exist'; 'in order to exist, a set needs its member(s) to exist'; and so on for creatures and creators; quantities of matter and their parts; tropes and their bearers; events and their temporal parts; holes and their hosts. Correia first rejects an account of simple dependence in terms of modal necessitation, so that the statement 'in order to exist, a needs b to exist' means (or is properly approximated by) 'it is metaphysically impossible that a exists and b does not'. One problem raised for this account is that it mischaracterizes the relationship of (e.g.) sets to their members: it yields the intuitively incorrect result that a singleton and its member are existentially dependent on each other, rather than granting the member ontological priority.

Another account of simple dependence invokes essences or natures: for a to simply depend on b is for it to be true in virtue of the nature of a that it exists only if b exists (49). Here 'truth in virtue of the nature of a' is not to be understood in terms of modal necessitation, but is taken as primitive; so from the mere fact that a singleton and its member object exist at all the same worlds, it does not follow that the object's essence somehow involves reference to its singleton. Correia raises two objections to this account. The first involves the example of a Leibnizian deity, who essentially causes the actual world to exist, but nevertheless is ontologically prior to the world -- He does not need the world in order to exist, its existence 'is just a fact which automatically arises out of some of His essential features' (51). The example, he insists, need not be plausible in order to serve its purpose: an investigation of the concept of simple dependence 'should be neutral with respect to particular metaphysical views' (9) and so leave room for any non-absurd substantial metaphysical position. (More on this below). Correia's second objection is related: 'Intuitively, there is room for philosophical positions which take the notion of simple dependence to be a legitimate one, but which at the same time deny the coherence of the … notion of essence' (68).

In chapters 3 and 4, Correia presents his own account of simple dependence. He begins by introducing the notion of metaphysical grounding, which he proposes to take as primitive, and in terms of which he proposes to understand simple dependence. Correia pumps the reader's intuitions by suggesting that ontological priority of an object to its singleton has something to do with the fact that the existence of the first (objectively) explains the existence of the second, and not vice versa. Put differently, the singleton exists in virtue of the fact that the object exists, and not vice versa. He offers putative examples of claims about metaphysical grounding: for example, 'The event that was Sam's walking yesterday exists in virtue of the fact that Sam was walking yesterday', 'The redness of this apple exists in virtue of the fact that the apple is red', 'the set {Socrates, Plato} exists in virtue of the fact that Socrates exists and the fact that Plato exists.' Correia expresses the notion as an unanalyzed variably polyadic sentential operator: 'A in virtue of the fact that B and the fact that C'.

After discussing at length some of the logical properties of grounding and partial grounding, Correia presents an initial account of simple dependence in terms of grounding: for a to simply depend on b is for it to be the case that necessarily, if a exists, some fact about b is among the facts in virtue of which a exists. (This is not exactly how Correia states it, because I am 'multiplying through' two newly defined relations that are interposed between the definition of 'grounding' and the final account of simple dependence; in the context of a review, at least, the proliferation of technical terms impedes perspicuity.) At this stage, Correia notes a final complication: given a certain set of assumptions, simple dependence on the proposed account will not be transitive. (I will pass over the argument for this.) For those who accept the relevant assumptions and are confident that simple dependence should be transitive, he offers a couple of alternatives, one of which is to substitute the transitive closure of the binary relation we just used to define simple dependence. The rest of chapter 4 is devoted to investigating the logical properties of -- and connections between -- all the relations defined so far.

In chapters 5 and 6, Correia finds more work for metaphysical grounding: he uses it to illuminate a host of intuitive dependence relations. Here are several examples: (i) Generic dependence is dependence on the existence of some thing or other of type F, rather than on a particular thing. (For Aristotelians, redness depends for its existence on the existence of red things.) Correia suggests a few ways to understand generic dependence in terms of metaphysical grounding. Among them: for a to generically depend on the Fs is for it to be metaphysically impossible for a to exist unless a exists in virtue of the fact that there is an existing F (97; here again I'm 'multiplying through'.). This and related notions are used to explore the Aristotelian idea of the dependence of universals on the bearers. (ii) Correia also provides a taxonomy of ways in which objects can be temporally dependent: an object might depend on the temporally prior existence of another object, or its simultaneous existence, etc. Again, Correia's view of dependence can take these notions in stride. (iii) There is a tradition of understanding the category of substances as those objects that are existentially independent. Correia suggests that those who wish to continue this tradition should invoke the previously defined relation of simple dependence and adopt a variation of this definition: 'x is a substance iff x is a concrete continuant which simply depends on nothing except its essential parts and its essential origins.' (iv) In the final chapter, Correia argues that a central intuition behind the notion of supervenience -- that the supervenient facts exist in virtue of subvenient facts -- cannot be captured by certain standard analyses of supervenience which allow it to be symmetric. In contrast, metaphysical grounding gives us the tools to define a family of supervenience relations that preserve the idea of the ontological priority of the subvenient.

Let me turn now to some concerns about Correia's methodology. Recall that the aim of the book is not to advance any particular metaphysical position: the project is one of conceptual analysis. But first, it isn't obvious that there is a single concept at work in all the philosophical judgments that are alleged to be paradigmatically about simple dependence. Why think there is only one notion at work behind a Leibnizian theist's assertion that creatures depend on their creator and a set-theorist's assertion that sets depend on their members? Maybe there are two notions here, each of which is asymmetric and so can't be reduced to a simple modal relation -- but for different reasons. Perhaps for the theist the relation has a causal element that contributes the asymmetry, while for the set theorist the relation involves something like asymmetric constitution. If we need causation, constitution, and modality anyway, such a treatment would help us avoid positing an extra primitive.

My second concern is that Correia is unclear about how much an analysis of the concept of existential dependence allows us to infer about the nature of the thing itself -- i.e. the metaphysical relation that answers to the concept. Recall Correia's 'neutrality policy', which states that accounts of existential dependence 'should leave room for … any substantial metaphysical position -- at least provided that the position is not absurd' (9). So, for instance, Correia discards the essentialist account of simple dependence (for a to simply depend on b is for it to be true in virtue of the nature of a that it exists only if b exists) because it doesn't leave room for a Leibnizian deity -- one that essentially causes the actual world to exist, but is not existentially dependent on it.

Suppose we have the intuition, e.g. that it is no part of the concept of existential dependence that there couldn't be a Leibnizian deity. Does it follow that existential dependence itself doesn't rule out such a deity? Not if existential dependence could outstrip our concept of it. For example, suppose that real natures provide the metaphysical underpinnings for necessity and the physical laws. And suppose there is, among the real relations actually instantiated by paradigmatic pairs like sets and their members, tropes and their bearers, etc, no better semantic candidate for the relation expressed by 'x depends on y to exist, in order to exist' than the relation offered by the essentialist. If things turn out this way, then the nature of existential dependence outstrips what we can know about it by direct conceptual analysis. If we could know a priori that it was identical to the essentialist relation, we could rule out the Leibnizian scenario a priori. But the mere fact that we can't rule it out a priori doesn't show that the identity doesn't hold or that the essentialist account is false.

The point is that conceptual analyses purporting to be neutral on substantive metaphysics can only get one so far if one cares primarily about the property that answers to the relevant concept. If one shares with Correia the intuition that the concept of existential dependence does not preclude the Leibnizian deity, then one has a reason, all other things being equal, to prefer an account of the relation itself that also allows the deity. But it's not the case that all other things are equal between Correia's account and the essentialist account: for one thing, if we have reason to accept essences anyway, Correia ends up with an extra fundamental relation. We are faced with a choice between a view on which our intuitions about existential dependence are a slightly better guide to its nature, and a view with a cleaner fundamental ontology. But how could we decide between these views while being neutral about substantive metaphysics?

In the end it's unclear how Correia comes down on the relationship between a theory of the concept of existential dependence and a theory of the relation itself. This obscures the status of his objections to rival accounts. On the other hand, he could hardly have resolved this difficult methodological issue, given the wealth of material already present in this excellent book.