Existential Eroticism: A Feminist Approach to Understanding Women's Oppression-Perpetuating Choices

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Shay Welch, Existential Eroticism: A Feminist Approach to Understanding Women's Oppression-Perpetuating Choices, 2015, Lexington Books, 227pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498505413.

Reviewed by Tracy Isaacs, Western University


Shay Welch's book is an ambitious feminist analysis of women's oppression-perpetuating choices. "Existential eroticism" is stipulated to mean "women's oppression qua beauty and sexuality" (2). Welch focuses on women's actions and choices within existential eroticism, specifically sex work and violent, abusive relationships, and grapples head on with topics of autonomy, agency, adaptive preferences, blame, and forgiveness. Feminist commentary sometimes erases women's agency in these contexts, either framing them as victims or dupes, or unapologetically blaming women for what, upon close inspection, amount to choices made under restrictions ranging from duress, to necessity, to systemic coercion. Welch maintains that the victim/wrongdoer dichotomy presents an oversimplified moral analysis of women's choices under patriarchy.

Methodologically, the book combines philosophical analysis in the context of relevant scholarship (both feminist and not) with powerful personal narratives (her own and others'), in order to "articulate and explicate the non-normative lived experience" of women caught in the complex forces of existential eroticism (21). She pays special attention to women marginalized by race, class, or poverty. In that respect, the book is reminiscent of works such as Gloria T. Hull, Patricia Bell-Scott, and Barbara Smith's But Some of Us Are Brave (1982) and Maria C. Lugones and Elizabeth V. Spelman's "Have We Got a Theory for You: Feminist Theory, Cultural Imperialism, and the Demand for 'The Woman's Voice'" (1983). These authors too claim that feminist theorists make sweeping claims and false generalizations about women as a group, but focus on the racial/cultural divide instead of existential eroticism.

The book consists of an introductory chapter followed by two distinct parts. Part I, "Understanding Existential Eroticism," engages theory and narrative to "articulate and explicate the non-normative lived experience" (21) of women who live in conditions of existential eroticism and whose choices, in a larger sense, might be said to perpetuate oppression. In Part II, "Theorizing Existential Eroticism," Welch introduces the notion of desperate rationality, and digs deep into the complex territory of individual moral responsibility, complicity, blame, and forgiveness.

Chapter One sets the theoretical context with Ann Cudd's work on women's complicit choices (7), Anita Superson's discussion of "right wing women" (8), and Uma Narayan's views on cultural ideology, the "rhetoric of choice," and "bargaining with patriarchy" (9-10). Welch rejects the idea that women's agency and rationality disappear under oppressive conditions. Within sex work, she introduces her taxonomy of the vixen, the stripper, and the hooker. Further, in contrast to "the victim" is "the fighter," who develops strategies and hones skills to protect herself from harm within traumatic contexts (15). Welch recounts wrenching personal stories of two beloved family members, Aunty Nancy -- victim -- and Welch's older sister -- fighter -- whose abuse she witnessed in her early years.

Chapter Two sets up the discussion of autonomy in existential eroticism in the context of Catharine MacKinnon's discussion of pleasure under patriarchy, questioning how, in a context where women's pleasure and worth is a function of male desire and the internalization of the male gaze, women can be autonomous in any meaningful way. Welch invokes the spirit, if not the letter, of third wave "sex positive" feminism to challenge the assumption that "more sexualized women are less autonomous than other women" (51).

Chapters Three, Four, and Five articulate and analyze individual and systemic forms of restriction under existential eroticism. Duress, necessity, and coercion warrant attention for their potential impact on women's agency, autonomy, and responsibility. As a collective context, oppression imposes unjust systemic, not just individualistic, restrictions on members of social groups as members of those social groups. These chapters contain moving narratives and careful analysis to develop the concepts of duress, necessity, and coercion as means of explaining women's choices under existential eroticism. Coercion is the most intense form of restriction because the threat for non-compliance is so severe that it's not a live option. One of the most important claims defended in these chapters is that extreme violence or the threat of extreme violence against women who deviate from the normative expectations/rules of proper "lady-ness" position existential eroticism as systemic coercion. Importantly, these chapters consistently, even if not perfectly, call attention to the way racism, classism, and sexuality work to exacerbate the restrictive conditions of existential eroticism. Chapter Five develops and defends the view that traumatizing conditions of abuse -- such as the harrowing narrative with which this chapter opens -- generate a desperation severe enough to produce coerced submission (119).

Chapter Six argues that traumatized women make strategic choices that are the by-products of what Welch terms "desperate rationality" (124). Within the theoretical framework of non-ideal game theory, she argues that women who survive violent existentially erotic circumstances engage in a sophisticated desperate rationality that enables them to manipulate horrific circumstances in ways that may appear compliant and irrational from the outside (e.g. to feminist scholars) but in fact involve careful strategizing (150).

Chapter Seven builds on the analysis of restriction and desperate rationality to consider moral responsibility for oppression-perpetuating acts. The discussion of moral responsibility draws on relatively recent perspectives from both "mainstream" and feminist philosophy, including those of Christopher Kutz on complicity (2000), Marion Smiley on social expectations (1992), Margaret Walker on social norms (2007), Claudia Card on gray zones (2000), and Tracy Isaacs on cultural contexts (1997). Both forward-looking and backward-looking responsibility vary according to levels of restriction, until desperation reaches the point of global, all-encompassing coercion, at which point neither form of responsibility is possible.

The underlying narrative about feminists blaming, without fully understanding, women who are caught in existential eroticism for perpetuating oppression through complicity grounds Chapter Eight's focus on intra-group blame and forgiveness. Not wanting to abandon blame altogether, she invokes T.M. Scanlon's conception of blame "as a marker of an impaired relationship" (198) that operates at a personal and an impersonal level. This serves well the circumstances of intra-group blame -- between feminists and other women -- and the further goal of relational repair. Blaming practices engender resentment, and resentment impedes repair. Therefore, a way forward, to intra-group forgiveness at the impersonal, collective level is needed. Feminists need to forgive the existentially erotic women they blame for perpetuating oppression, but feminists also need to be forgiven for "their exclusionary tactics" (211). Welch argues that the onus is on academic and activist feminists to move first on the forgiveness front because of their "explicit commitments to liberatory ethical values" (212).

Existential Eroticism is ambitious in scope. It constitutes an original contribution to discussions of oppression, particularly accounts that seek to do justice to diverse women's experiences and are critical of what has come to be viewed as white middle class feminism (whether academic or activist). Introducing a more nuanced discussion of complicity within a feminist understanding of existential eroticism, Welch provides a convincing account of degrees of responsibility tempered by degrees of restriction. Her account moves beyond the agency-erasure of totalizing oppression theories that cast women as victims. There is much to admire in the book.

It also leaves the reader with some lingering questions and issues. One puzzling feature is the term "existential eroticism" itself. It's unclear what is existential or erotic about the topic at hand. Though Welch stipulates the meaning as women's oppression qua sexuality and beauty (2), there is no explanation of how she decided on the term "existential eroticism." It's catchy, but if you look too closely you might find yourself at a loss.

Methodologically, the narratives add texture and richness while at the same time making it easier not to misrepresent the lives of existentially erotic women who, because they are "non-normative," are frequently misunderstood by feminist scholars. The problems of speaking for others (by assuming knowledge of their experiences, motives, and circumstances) and of exclusion within feminism are divisive and damaging. Welch calls out feminists' tendency to exoticize women in the sex industry or with abusive partners. Perhaps the narratives shouldn't be expected to play a further methodological role. They are a welcome, if often harrowing, addition to the work. However, as philosophers, might we draw any further conclusions from the narratives? Do they help readers understand existential eroticism in a way that supports the theorizing that occurs in the final three chapters? While those chapters pick up on some of the theoretical concepts from Part I, the narratives themselves don't come back into play. It would be useful, if uncomfortable, to revisit some of the earlier narratives to help illustrate the more abstract theoretical points about degrees of blame and responsibility for actions and contributions.

Another worry concerns whether Welch's discussion falsely dichotomizes feminists and "other" women in existential eroticism. While no academic feminist would deny that she experiences a large degree of privilege, and while very few are likely (at least concurrent with their careers in academia) involved in sex work, it's highly probable that some have had (or have) the experience of abuse and the vast majority have experienced oppression qua sexuality and beauty. If existential eroticism just is "oppression qua sexuality and beauty," then the "us and them" split supposes a starker border between feminists and existentially erotic women than exists. A related concern arises with the label "non-normative women" because, arguably, many feminists are non-normative (in a different way) and many existentially erotic women are in many ways normative, at least in terms of their femininity. Welch's attention to intersectionality and marginalization helps to explain her line of thought here -- introducing racism, classism, and poverty as prevalent factors in sex work and abusive relationships explains the sense in which the women she's concerned with might be non-normative. Nevertheless, without claiming that feminists have a thorough understanding of every woman's experience under patriarchy or denying their privilege, we might still have reasons to acknowledge that the life experiences of many feminists take them out of the ivory tower and into existentially erotic contexts. Existential eroticism doesn't end where the ivory tower begins.

Welch uses Kutz on complicity (2000) to support her view that women constitute an unstructured collective and share the collective end of successful and compulsory femininity. Kutz explicitly accounts for cases in which groups of people who are not intentionally acting together nevertheless produce cumulative harms through their actions. In that respect then, his work seems, at first, to be a good choice for Welch's theoretical purposes. However, given her claim that feminist scholars have done a poor job of recognizing and appreciating differences among women, falsely generalizing from their positions of privilege, it's surprising that she promotes this idea of women as a social group with a common collective end even in this thin sense. And while interesting, it's not entirely clear what Kutz's analysis of complicity and inclusive accountability does to advance Welch's analysis. She either needs to draw out the details and implications of quasi-participatory accountability further, or set aside Kutz's analysis because it invites exactly the sorts of exclusionary, generalizing theorizing she seeks to avoid.

Despite these areas where the account Welch provides might benefit from further explication, Existential Eroticism is a compelling and original contribution to feminist philosophy. It raises and attempts to resolve important issues about complicity under systemic conditions of disadvantage under patriarchy and grapples with the uncomfortable territory of intra-group blame and resentment, while providing a constructive way forward in intra-group forgiveness. Most of all, Welch successfully achieves her goal of providing a nuanced account in which women living in some of the most desperate scenarios of existential eroticism are not simply to be understood as victims or dupes, but in fact as agents, sometimes blameworthy sometimes not, sometimes fighters, and sometimes employing highly sophisticated forms of desperate rationality.


Card, Claudia. 2000. "Women, Evil, and Gray Zones." Metaphilosophy. Vol. 1, No. 5: 509-528.

Cudd, Ann. 2006. Analyzing Oppression. Oxford University Press.

Hay, Carol. 2005. "Whether to Ignore Them and Spin: Moral Obligations to Resist Sexual Harassment," Hypatia, Vol. 20, No. 4: 98-108.

Hull, Gloria T., Patricia Bell-Scott, and Barbara Smith. 1982. But Some of Us Are Brave: All the Women Are White, All the Blacks Are Men: Black Women's Studies. Feminist Press.

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Kutz, Christopher. 2000. Complicity. Cambridge University Press.

Lugones, Maria C. and Elizabeth V. Spelman. 1983. "Have We Got a Theory for You! Feminist Theory, Cultural Imperialism, and the Demand for 'the Women's Voice.'" Women's Studies International Forum, Vol. 6, No. 6: 573-581.

Narayan, Uma. 2002. "Minds of Their Own: Choices, Autonomy, Cultural Practices, and Other Women." In A Mind of One's Own: Feminist Essays on Reason and Objectivity. Edited by Louise M. Antony and Charlotte E. Witt. Westview Press, pp. 418-432.

Smiley, Marion. 1992. Moral Responsibility and the Boundaries of Community: Power and Acountability from a Pragmatic Point of View. University of Chicago Press.

Superson, Anita. 1995. "Right Wing Women: Causes, Choices, and Blaming the Victim." In Nagging Questions. Edited by Dana Bushnell. Rowman and Littlefield.

Walker, Margaret Urban. 2007. Moral Understandings: A Feminist Study in Ethics. Oxford University Press.