Existential Utopia: New Perspectives on Utopian Thought

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Patricia Vieira and Michael Marder (eds.), Existential Utopia: New Perspectives on Utopian Thought, Continuum, 2011, 172pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781441169211.

Reviewed by Ian James, Downing College


Vieira and Marder's timely collection of essays begins with a very straightforward question that is posed in relation to the contemporary world: 'Is there any space, whether conceptual or practical, for the thinking of utopia?' (x). In a certain sense such a question may appear distinctly untimely insofar as we might most readily conceive ourselves as being situated in a historical period marked by a post-utopian outlook and by the recent failures of utopian-inspired political projects. Yet it is precisely the challenge of reinventing the seemingly exhausted legacy of utopian thought that this volume takes up. As the editors convincingly argue, this challenge is one of thinking the concept of utopia within a post-metaphysical space and stripped of the theological and Platonist inheritance 'to which it is irreducible' (xiii). As such it is a question of thinking utopia and utopian possibilities in ways which would avoid the potentially violent, totalizing operation of grand narratives on the one hand and the potentially disabling or value-corroding character of relativism on the other. At stake, then, is the possibility of mobilizing the utopian legacy in order to open up a common horizon for social action and shared political projects but also at the same time to account for 'separation, difference, and dissensus' (xi) in ways which would avoid the mediations of state, religious association or communitarian belonging.

To this end Vieira and Marder have created the concept of 'existential utopia', one which aims to strip the traditional utopian project of its ideal or transcendent dimension and to reground it in the relations and articulations of shared material existence. It is in this context that the contemporary French philosopher Jean-Luc Nancy's reworking of existential phenomenology and fundamental ontology becomes a decisive point of reference. Nancy's philosophy of sense, of shared existence or being-with, and the ontology of the 'singular plural' which underpins his thinking as a whole, offer a new set of initial coordinates for the existential recasting of the utopian. It is fitting, therefore, that the first chapter of the book is an essay by Nancy himself, 'In Place of Utopia', which is followed by an interview with the editors.

Nancy takes the concept of utopia and entirely rearticulates it outside of its traditional philosophical meaning and does so in the context of his reworked ontological thought. This is a typical gesture on his part: repeating the reinvention of traditional philosophical terms that he carries out elsewhere in his work, terms such as 'sense', 'world', 'creation', 'touch' and so on. Thus, for Nancy, utopia needs now to be thought as an 'evidence of finitude' (7) and of finitude understood in the very particular sense which he gives to the term from the late 1980s onwards. The finitude in question is that of the plural, worldly and embodied existence of beings that exist at their limits, exposed to the unlimited, to a (material or actual) infinite or to an irreducible excess over being. This exposure of finite beings 'at their limit' to ungrounded, infinite and irreducible excess is the very opening or production of a shared meaningful world itself, 'the order of a sharing/partitioning of meaning' (8) through which we experience a world as world. So the non-place of utopia here is thought as this excess over world, thought, sense and meaning.

Utopia is always at stake in that sharing and partitioning of sense which, for Nancy, produces a world as such. Thus it becomes an 'outside place that operates at the heart of the real' (10), it is a non-place of meaning, ground, or of time and place that always opens within, and always has the potential to interrupt, any and all experience of a situated, historical world. The task of a utopian thought or a utopian project would, in this context, be one of finding ways of responding to or doing justice to the non-totalizable infinity or non-place at the heart of the real. It would be a task of locating the necessity or the event of the suspension and interruption of our existing frames of worldly meaning in order then to produce new meanings and new worlds which would be born of the infinity of shared material, worldly existence and which, at the same time, would do justice to it.

Nancy's recasting of the utopian in this opening essay, together with his contemporary response to what is now a twelve-year-old piece helpfully marks out the possibilities and potential difficulties of the editors' project of thinking 'existential utopia'. Firstly, it is striking that, in his answers to the interview questions given by the editors, Nancy immediately rejects the category of utopia outright, deeming it 'even more empty than it was when I wrote the text' (11) (i.e., in early 2000). It must have been rather disappointing for the editors to find Nancy now so distant from the motif of utopia that their volume is attempting to reinvigorate. Yet the shift in his position is perhaps indicative of an ambivalence which has run through Nancy's thinking of the ontological and its relation to the political from at least the beginning of the 1980s when he collaborated with Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe in the Centre for Philosophical Research on the Political.

On the face of it Nancy's rejection of the utopian is straightforward. He is no longer, he says, interested in any thinking of a place without place but wants to focus on the 'here-and-now' (11). Yet, when it comes to politics or the political, the question of 'focusing on the here-and-now' in the context of Nancy's thought is arguably always one of negotiating or tracing the passage from the ontological to the political. It may always be a question of determining how and in what way an ontology of the singular plural, or a thinking of being-with might inform, shape, demand or dictate a specific politics or set of political values, actions or commitments. Yet this is always a problem for Nancy, one which informed his early collaboration with Lacoue-Labarthe where it was the 'withdrawal' or 'retreat' of any transcendental or ontological ground of, and for, the political that was to be thought.

From the beginning of his career Nancy has sought to avoid any philosophical gesture which would seek to establish such a transcendental or ontological ground for a political project, for fear that it might reproduce or repeat the logic of totalizing immanence of the very kind that he and Lacoue-Labarthe saw to be at work in twentieth-century totalitarian projects. So just as Nancy's thinking of shared existence, of being-with, and of the singular plural demands that politics should take our unbounded, ungrounded finitude into account and do justice to it, so at the very same time we should never appeal to that finitude as any kind of ground or transcendental instance which would legitimate or philosophically programme in advance any specific political project.

In short, the ontological relation and the practice of politics should never be collapsed one into the other. Rather they need to be kept separate or apart. Nancy's essay on utopia reproduced here is clearly an attempt to renegotiate this problem some twenty years after his initial work with Lacoue-Labarthe on the 'retreat' of the political. The fact that he returns to this question in so many different ways throughout his career, and the fact that he now rejects his engagement with utopia of twelve years ago suggests, however, that this is an issue which he has never entirely resolved.

Existential Utopia is an ambitious attempt to engage further with this key unresolved problem of Nancean thought. As such it compliments well Martin Crowley's recent work, L'Homme sans [The Human Without]. Crowley's is without doubt the most thoughtful and accomplished book published to date which responds to this difficulty within Nancy's thinking and, more broadly, to a twentieth-century French tradition which seeks to recast the political out from a reworked ontology and thinking of existential finitude. What Crowley calls the 'proposition of finitude' articulates, like Nancy's ontology of the singular plural, a shared existence which is only as shared. In so doing, however, Crowley's thesis is that such an ontology both commands in principle and demands in practice a solidarity of each being with another and with that a fundamental existential equality. The argument that a thinking of finitude (understood in the Nancean sense) can both command and demand solidarity and equality allows for a clear negotiation, or tracing, of the passage from the ontological to the political, from philosophy to politics. It does so, arguably, without collapsing the two together and without falling into the trap of trying to lay a transcendental ground for the political. Crowley's work offers a very useful point of reference for assessing and evaluating the stakes of Vieira and Marder's conception of existential utopia and of Nancy's apparent outright rejection of the utopian legacy.

For what Crowley, Vieira and Marder have in common, and what Nancy himself never entirely resolves or remains comfortable with, is a demand that the thinking of shared finite existence itself demands that we negotiate or trace this passage from the ontological to the political in specific and determinate ways. It is arguably only in the passage from the one to the other that any politics of the 'here and now' can be thought. To be fair Nancy has continued in recent years, most obviously in his short work The Truth of Democracy, to engage with this problem through a reinvention of traditional (political) terms in the light of his ontological thought. Yet he still maintains an insistence that the ontological register should remain distinct from the political register.

Existential utopia then, like the proposition of finitude outlined in L'Homme sans, aims to articulate possible political projects or shared practices out of ontological relations without laying any metaphysical ground or universal teleology for politics as such. Paying attention to the materiality, multiplicity and the ungroundedness of shared worldly existence, what existential utopia would propose would be a 'series of fleeting and precarious universals' (xii) which would be articulated from out of the empty spaces of meaning which open up from within the inevitable breaks and ruptures of existing semantic networks and historical forms. Existential utopia aims to exploit the inevitable exhaustion of world-forms and to produce meanings which would emerge from or out of our ontological relations: those of being-with, of a material embodied existence which is always shared, but always exposed to a non-space of meaning, to the rupture and hiatus of existing frameworks. At stake, then, is the possibility of projecting and creating new worlds of meaning out of the inevitable exhaustion of old forms and of making a viable collective politics from this act of projection and creation.

Given this framework it is entirely to be expected that the range of essays included in this volume is very diverse and by no means always reducible to the specifically Nancean framework from which the editors take their own initial coordinates. The volume contains an excellent essay by Gianni Vattimo on the concept of 'counter-utopia' and essays which place themselves well outside the Heideggerian legacy of existential phenomenology including chapters on Bloch, Deleuze and an outstanding piece on utopia and social theory and practice by Laurence Davis. Davis's analysis of certain forms of popular culture, and in particular of Ursula LeGuin's utopian and dystopian works of science fiction, shows very well how widely the utopian idea has continued to circulate throughout the culture of the late twentieth and early twenty-first centuries. The distinction he makes between 'transcendent' and 'grounded' utopias also very helpfully shows the breadth and real potential of the existential recasting of the utopian beyond the predominantly theoretical concerns of this collection and within the wider field of social theory and practice.

Vieira and Marder's volume is therefore to be welcomed as a highly valuable contribution to on-going debates around post-metaphysical conceptions of the political and the possibility of anti-foundationalist political projects. The diversity and quality of the essays presented demonstrate the productive possibilities of the 'fleeting, precarious universals' they invoke and the necessity for these debates to be continued and responded to with urgency and commitment.