Expanding Responsibility for the Just War: A Feminist Critique

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Rosemary Kellison, Expanding Responsibility for the Just War: A Feminist Critique, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 256pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108473149.

Reviewed by Adam Thomas Betz, Centre College


The principle of non-combatant immunity requires that combatants direct their attacks only at enemy combatants and war-sustaining facilities. Civilians are off limits. Modern warfare could not, however, be justly fought if harm to civilians were absolutely prohibited. Serious harms to civilians predictably occur even in a just war and, in many cases, combatants may be certain that these harms will occur as a side effect of their actions. Just war theorists commonly appeal to the 'doctrine of double effect' (DDE) to explain how these harms can be justified, or at least excused. They have proposed many revisions to the DDE, endeavoring to account for concerns about recklessness and negligence, requirements of due care, and the balance between risk-taking and force protection. All variants of the doctrine maintain that harm to civilians must not be intended. Combatants and other agents of harm who satisfy the conditions of the DDE are not held responsible, legally or morally, for harms to innocent civilians.

In the book, Rosemary Kellison emphasizes the importance of intention to the just war, but in a way that is critical of just war theorists' allegedly narrow understanding of intention. Kellison presents and endorses the feminist method of critiquing norms and practices that construct or reinforce relationships characterized by vast imbalances of power and vulnerability. War and its attendant harm to civilians compound these imbalances and create social conditions in the aftermath of war which exacerbate civilian vulnerability to violence. She proposes to expand responsibility for harms to civilians by arguing for a more expansive picture of what counts as an intended effect of an agent's actions. On Kellison's interpretation, just war theorists understand intention as a "disembodied, private, momentary thought" (103). Intention within the DDE has four features: 1) it is a mental state that is distinct from an act; 2) that mental state is related to "single specific acts"; 3) it is distinct from foresight; and 4) it presupposes that humans are "often successful in achieving their intentions" (109). Kellison argues that this view of intention has enabled the U.S. military, its civilian leadership, and the American public to evade responsibility for harms caused to innocent civilians in the U.S.'s conflicts in Afghanistan, Iraq, and Syria -- what have become known as the U.S.'s 'post-9/11 wars.'

As Kellison characterizes it, the mainstream view of intention regards each person as an entirely independent agent who is solely responsible for at least some of one's actions and character traits. Drawing on the feminist theory of 'relationality', Kellison develops a novel challenge to this view. Relationality maintains that morality consists of our practices of "assigning responsibilities, identifying to whom responsibilities are owed, fulfilling or evading responsibilities, and holding people accountable for failure to meet their responsibilities" (35). Human relationality consists of the fact that we are embodied creatures, dependent on one another to fulfill our basic needs, and to shape our sense of identity. The autonomous self is not radically independent but is the product of a complex web of interdependent relationships. This interdependence renders us to some degree vulnerable to one another and, correlatively, gives us "as members of communities in which agents are formed" a share of responsibility for each other's well-being and for each other's actions (31-2, 172). Intentions are shaped by our social and physical environments, our essential embodiment, and our access to resources. Our understanding of our individual intentions essentially depends on our interactions with others and our intentions are in turn shaped by and revealed in the context of social relationships (103). Kellison endorses Robert Brandom's Hegelian view that "the description of an act and its consequences is a constitutive part of the intention itself" (110), and so the doing of an act shapes and reveals a person's character. An agent's intentions are her habitual character shaped by, and revealed within, her relationships and social context (111). The behavioral patterns we display over time enable others to construct narratives about our intentions and character. Relationality implies that intentions are inherently public and extended over time, not private and momentary mental states.

One of Kellison's principal contentions is that the mainstream view of intention has ignored human relationality, and this oversight has enabled war-makers to evade responsibility for civilian harm. War-makers have been able to claim that many of these harms are unintended 'collateral damage', and the fact that harm is not intentional is part of what exculpates harm-doers from punishment or releases them from responsibility to compensate civilian victims: 'responsibility', on this view, is synonymous with 'culpability'. These evasions of responsibility have had dire consequences for the civilian victims of the post-9/11 wars. War makers' failure to take responsibility for harm to civilians is also evident in the inadequate compensation civilians have received for their injuries and losses (201-210). Kellison argues that few if any variants of contemporary just war theory are concerned with who should take responsibility for these harms, in what that responsibility would consist, or what the basis of that responsibility is (chapter 2).

Relationality has interesting implications for how we understand responsibility for acts of harming in war and its aftermath. First, intention can be attributed to "collective agents such as militaries or states," not just individuals (112, 155). Second, if an agent knows that her actions will result in side effect harms to civilians, those actions may count as intended (6). Third, some unforeseen effects of an agent's actions can count as intended, since it might be that those effects should have been foreseen (130). The relational account broadens the scope of what counts as intended harm and narrows the scope of what counts as unintended harm. An implication is that "all harmdoing -- whether or not it is also classified as wrongdoing -- engenders . . . responsibility" (158). Although relationality limits our autonomy (because it implies that we are not radically independent agents), it also enables an expansion of responsibility -- in particular, collective and organizational responsibility for harm.

Collectives have agency in the sense that an organization and its members develop and display habits and dispositions, whose performance over time provides evidence of their commitment to the values and intentions they profess. An organization (or person) that (or who) genuinely has the intention to spare civilians will observably harm fewer civilians over time (6). They will also display their intention not to harm civilians and their active intention to protect civilians by improving standards of due care and reforming practices that caused civilian harm in the past. They might, for instance, admit to and correct mistakes, reform flaws in their policies and systems of deliberation, and perform more rigorous investigative work necessary to uphold jus in bello norms. In the absence of these changes in individual and organizational practices of due care, civilian victims will justly question whether the U.S. is waging its post-9/11 wars with the right intention.

An implication of Kellison's relational theory of intention is thus that the upholding of jus in bello norms of discrimination and due care is inherently connected to the satisfaction of the jus ad bellum requirement of right intention (186). Satisfying right intention is essential to satisfying the jus post bellum principles. For "when agents fail to adhere to jus ad bellum and jus in bello norms" and "fail to take responsibility for harms caused by intentional or unintentional violations of those norms, just and lasting peace becomes less likely." Consequently, "issues of concern to theorists of jus post bellum cannot be confined to the postwar setting" (187). Taking responsibility for harm to civilians, in bello, is essential for upholding both ad bellum and post bellum norms of just war. The connections Kellison makes between the relational theory of intention and the ad bellum, in bello, and post bellum components of just war theory, and the interrelatedness of those three components to each other, are among the most interesting contributions of the book. They should advance the debate concerning right intention among just war theorists and scholars of peace building alike.

Kellison does an admirable job depicting harms to civilians and rightly criticizes just war theorists for neglecting many aspects of the violence of war. She vividly characterizes the experiences of civilian victims, making compelling arguments for politicians, military planners, and indeed all Americans to take greater responsibility for these harms. Chapter 3 includes a penetrating discussion of harms to civilians resulting from drone strikes. Risks of death and physical injury are part of this picture, but Kellison focuses especially on disruption to people's ordinary social and community life. These harms include "the loss of trust in others, fear and trauma, the diminishment of autonomy, and the loss of a consistent sense of self and purpose" (90). The threat of drone strikes has impaired civilians' capacities for relational autonomy: the capacity for self-determination and self-reflection that is constituted by social relationships (28-9). These aspects of what has become known as 'moral injury', according to Kellison, "are not best described as rights violations" (5, 90). Also included is a welcome discussion of moral injury to soldiers, the "feelings of brokenness brought about by killing or other actions performed during war," feelings which arise even among soldiers who have violated no rules of engagement (78, 80). That this book is free of hypotheticals involving runaway trolleys or utilitarian surgeons, and instead focuses on real harm to real people, will be a refreshing change for many readers.

Kellison argues in Chapter 6 that recognizing the full moral standing of civilian victims involves making visible commitments to repair harms, to make amends through adequate compensation and public apology, and, especially for ordinary Americans, to develop a more vivid moral imagination about the impact of the wars their country wages. Relationality implies that civilians in countries whose wars cause harm to enemy civilians share responsibility for those harms; another virtue of this book is that it provides specific prescriptions for how they can take responsibility (214-15).

This book has many strengths, but its engagement with contemporary just war theory is not among them. There are several important theorists omitted from the references. CAJ Coady, C├ęcile Fabre, Frances Kamm, David Luban, Stephen Nathanson, Igor Primoratz, Warren Quinn, and Victor Tadros, among others, are conspicuously absent. It is astonishing that a book that focuses so heavily on intention, collateral damage, and moral responsibility for the just war could be published in 2019 and not discuss these thinkers' arguments, but the omission of Seth Lazar's Sparing Civilians is especially glaring.[1] In part owing to these scholarly shortcomings, Kellison's criticisms of liability- and rights-based accounts of harm are wanting.

Kellison rejects theories of liability to harm, such as those of Jeff McMahan and Helen Frowe, that focus on individual responsibility for an unjust war, largely on the grounds that these theories imply that some civilians could, in principle, be legitimate targets of attack. She suggests that "one explanation for McMahan's and Frowe's expansion of noncombatants' liability during war is their conception of persons as free and independent individuals rather than as relational" which "leads them to overemphasize the freedom of individuals' choices and actions and thus to collapse responsibility into liability" (67). A better, and more charitable, explanation is that legitimate defensive force is, for McMahan, a matter of justice in the distribution of inevitable and indivisible harms, a consideration that potentially implicates civilians. If someone must suffer a harm, it is fairer for that harm to befall the liable than the non-liable party.[2] That McMahan's theory does not account for relationality is beside the point.

Liability-based theories like McMahan's and Frowe's do raise admittedly discomfiting questions about the moral status of civilians, but they also explain, crucially, why unjust combatants would be legitimate targets of attack. Since Kellison does not wish to commit herself to pacifism (230), she needs an account of why attacking combatants is permissible. Given her rejection of individualistic views of autonomy and liability, however, it is unclear how Kellison's theory of relational autonomy could account for the significance it attributes to the distinction between combatants and noncombatants. Are combatants morally liable? If so, by virtue of what moral and non-moral facts that apply to all and only combatants? Or have they waived their rights against attack? These possibilities presuppose the "narrow" individualistic view of autonomy that Kellison rejects. If there exists a relational theory of liability or consent that can ground the combatant-noncombatant distinction, it is not offered in this book.

A richer account of rights also seems apt to describe many of the harms that Kellison says are characteristic of moral injury to civilians. The fact that war makers' actions cause an erosion of social trust, engender hopelessness and perpetual fear of drone strikes, threaten communal solidarity, and increase risks of injury and death, constitute violations of these civilians' vital interest in security, and thus their right to security according to the Interest Theory of rights.

Kellison also underestimates the resources of a rights-based framework to account for combatants' and policy makers' responsibility to protect civilians through more extensive practices of due care in preventing collateral harm, or to recognize, repair, and compensate for the harms that do occur. The interest of civilians in security again does the normative work. Civilians are insecure when combatants are inadequately disposed to minimize collateral harm by seeking less hazardous means of achieving military goals; flout their epistemic duties to determine if their actions are likely to harm civilians; or are averse to accepting risks to themselves to spare civilians. Agents of harm who fail to discharge responsibilities of due care display a disregard for the moral status of the victims, whether or not these failures are intentional. Even if Kellison is correct that just war theorists should expand their view of responsibility for harm, they can do so by attending to the defeasible right to security against unchosen risks of endangerment as part of what underpins soldiers' and war makers' responsibilities of due care.[3] Expanding responsibility for the just war can be accomplished by taking into account the full spectrum of civilians' rights, not necessarily relationality.

Although some readers may be dissatisfied with her book's impoverished analysis of contemporary just war theory, Kellison nonetheless makes important contributions to our understanding of right intention, collective agency, and post bellum responsibility. The relational theory of agency is fascinating in its own right, even if Kellison overstates the need for just war theorists to adopt it.


Thanks to Thomas Betz and Jeff McMahan for comments on an earlier version of this review.

[1] Lazar, Seth. 2015. Sparing Civilians, Oxford: Oxford University Press. Lazar's analysis of vulnerability at 101-122 is particularly relevant, given Kellison's emphasis on power and vulnerability.

[2] McMahan, Jeff. 2005. "The Basis of Moral Liability to Defensive Killing." Philosophical Issues 15, Normativity, 386-405.

[3] On the importance of the value of security in grounding the right against endangerment, see Lazar Sparing Civilians, 81-84.