Experience and the World's Own Language: A Critique of John McDowell's Empiricism

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Richard Gaskin, Experience and the World's Own Language: A Critique of John McDowell's Empiricism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 251pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199287252.

Reviewed by Jason Bridges, University of Chicago


Experience and the World's Own Language is a critique of John McDowell's attempt, in Mind and World and companion articles, to make room for a "minimal empiricism". Gaskin's book is of considerable interest -- in part because of the independent interest of some of the positive views developed therein, and in part as an example of the peculiar susceptibility of McDowell's work, even in the case of a philosopher as acute and sophisticated as Gaskin, to misunderstanding. In this review I will focus on the latter source of the book's interest.

Gaskin's critique is wide-ranging. In chapter two, Gaskin raises worries about the relationship in McDowell's picture between perceptual experience and the world that is the object of experience, and queries McDowell's treatment of the concept of nature. In chapter three, Gaskin challenges the connection McDowell asserts between freedom and judgment, and argues that McDowell's minimal empiricism ought to be replaced by a "minimalist empiricism", in which perceptual experiences are said to have conceptual content only in a much less demanding sense of "conceptual" than McDowell himself employs. In chapter four, Gaskin objects to McDowell's views on the capacities of non-human animals. In chapter five, Gaskin offers a hypothesis about the source of McDowell's errors, and in the final chapter he develops some implications of this diagnosis.

I will discuss three places in which, as I see it, Gaskin grasps neither the point nor the basis of the views he critiques. There are several other such places, but I focus on those that I do because I take them to exemplify misunderstandings that have wider currency in the secondary literature on McDowell. (Other questionable elements of Gaskin's treatment, such as the attempt, at the end of the book, to diagnose the aspects of McDowell's views that Gaskin dislikes as symptoms of a never fully acknowledged skepticism about the ontological category of property, are more idiosyncratic.)

It will help to begin with a very brief recap of the story told in Mind and World (Harvard University Press, 1996). We are, or ought to be, attracted to the idea that perceptual experience is a "tribunal" -- an occasion on which our thoughts are made to answer to the world they are about. Viewing experience as a tribunal involves supposing that experiences serve for the subject as reasons for and against judgments and attitudes, and in so doing, shape the subject's judgments and attitudes. But there is a problem in seeing how this supposition could be borne out. On the one hand, human perceptual experience, being an instance of the more general phenomenon of an animal's sensory capacities putting it in touch with the surrounding environment, is clearly a natural occurrence, and natural occurrences, as we moderns know, are the explanatory province of the natural sciences. On the other hand, we are attracted, or ought to be attracted, to the idea that the "space of reasons" is sui generis -- that we cannot construct normative (justificatory, reason-involving) facts out of non-normative conceptual materials. This would exclude in particular the conceptual materials of the natural sciences, organized as they are around the concept of a natural law rather than that of a normative relationship. And so the question arises: how can we view an experience both as the natural phenomenon it evidently is and as belonging to the space of reasons -- as the 'tribunal' conception requires?

Various philosophical views about experience, such as the myth of the Given and Davidsonian coherentism, can be construed as responses to an awareness, however inchoate or partial, of this problem. These views fail to solve the problem and are hopeless in themselves. A better solution is to see our way to a relaxed conception of the natural. We can give due respect to the role of the natural sciences in making the natural world intelligible to us while stopping short of presuming that everything that happens or is so in the natural world can be fully explained and understood in natural-scientific discourse. There is then no problem in countenancing an experience as natural even if some of the characteristic claims we make about that experience -- as, for example, when we cite that experience as the subject's reason for a belief -- cannot be captured in natural-scientific terms.

So, at any rate, McDowell argues. A recurring protest on Gaskin's part is that McDowell does not adequately explain the key concepts and moves involved in his resolution of the dilemma. The first misunderstanding I'll consider is an instance of this protest.

McDowell suggests that disquiet about a relaxed conception of the natural may be alleviated by the thought that the capacities and states constitutive of our access to the space of reasons are "second nature" to us. Gaskin objects that McDowell doesn't say enough about second nature for this suggestion to be of help. In particular, since McDowell has little to say about the relationship between our second nature and our "first nature", which McDowell himself acknowledges to be fully explicable in natural-scientific terms, the appeal to second nature can at best license a redescription of the problem. Gaskin writes,

If the original problem was how to fit reason into a world understood naturalistically (giving this word its traditional gloss, by adverting to facts of exclusively first nature), the redescribed problem is how to fit reason into a world understood nomologically. (p. 38)

A solution to that problem must involve "an account of how second laws [i.e., normative facts] emerge from first laws [i.e., natural laws]: we need a genealogy of the normative" (p. 39).

Now, if the question addressed by McDowell's appeal to second nature really were that of "how to fit reason into a world understood naturalistically" (in the "traditional" sense of that word that Gaskin has in mind), then the appeal would appear, at best, ridiculously inadequate. Indeed, one might well wonder how McDowell could possibly have thought it satisfactory. But McDowell is not addressing that question. The appeal to second nature is not designed to help us see how to fit reason into a world understood naturalistically; it's designed to help us see how to fit reason into the world understood as natural. The appeal is supposed to accomplish this by warding off the inclination to move from an acknowledgment of the sui generis character of the space of reasons to the conclusion that our access to the space of reasons must be somehow supernatural. And it's supposed to accomplish this in turn by reminding us that our access to the space of reasons is part of the lives we live as the kind of animal we are.

Providing such a reminder may seem a very slight thing to do. Indeed, in comparison with the efforts contemporary philosophers of mind undertake under the rubric of "naturalism", it is. Nonetheless, that is the entire point of the appeal. And clearly, providing the reminder does not amount to an attempt to explain, in any sense at all, how reason "fits" into the world conceived "exclusively" in natural-scientific terms. Rather, the suggestion is that we don't need to do that in order to accept reason as a natural phenomenon. The idea that reason is an integral element in the lives of a certain kind of animal is what is supposed to secure its connection to the natural.

Of course, there are familiar philosophical puzzles, real or apparent, about the relationship between the reason-involving states and episodes in our lives and the physical facts. For example, philosophers have argued that the fact that our bodies are composed of material governed by purely mechanical laws is inconsistent with the freedom we apparently ascribe to human beings when we explain their actions in intentional, reason-involving terms. But there are two points to make here. First, it is not obvious how the existence of such puzzles undermines McDowell's thought that a phenomenon's being an integral part of the lives of a kind of animal establishes its credentials as natural. One would need to actually argue that some particular such puzzle undermines this thought. Second and correlatively, it is no objection at all to McDowell's appeal to simply demand, without referencing any particular such puzzle, that McDowell explain how reason fits into the world understood naturalistically.

I don't wish to defend McDowell's appeal to second nature, which, as it happens, I don't find especially felicitous. I take it he was attracted to the term "second nature" for two reasons: it contains the word "nature", and it is apt as a description of Aristotle's view of the status of ethical knowledge, given Aristotle's emphasis on the role of training and habituation in inculcating virtue. McDowell's inclusion of a discussion of Aristotle's ethical thought makes sense in and of itself; he takes Aristotle's treatment of ethics to be a good example of a depiction of a rational activity that portrays that activity as natural without evincing any inclination to recast it in "baldly naturalistic" terms. The problem is that the notion of nature involved in talk of second nature is that according to which an object's nature is something like its character, its normal way of being. And that notion of nature is not directly connected to the notion of nature at stake when we ask, e.g., whether the realm of the natural is exhausted by the realm of law. We can see this by noting that there is nothing conceptually incoherent in positing a being whose nature, in the relevant sense, is supernatural (setting aside any incoherence in the idea of the supernatural as such). This point holds particularly of second nature: consider the film critic Kenneth Turan's comment on Hayao Miyazaki's "ease with fantasy that makes enchantment second nature" (Los Angeles Times, June 10, 2005), or the recent, enormously successful series of books whose central conceit is a school for training adolescents in the development and proper use of their magical talents -- rendering that use second nature, as one might want to say.

In the context of Mind and World, then, talk of "second nature" is less a suggestive piece of terminology than a weak pun, and the point of McDowell's invocation of Aristotle's conception of ethics would probably have been less vulnerable to misunderstanding had he avoided it. Losing that terminology would, for example, have prevented Gaskin's perception that McDowell is using "second nature" as the name for a special domain of the natural, to be set alongside the domain of something called "first nature".

McDowell's case would also have been improved had he not tied natural science so tightly to the concept of law. I would argue that our ordinary way of explaining the behavior of non-rational animals is not even tacitly nomological, but rather, broadly speaking, teleological -- a matter of seeing how what an animal does conduces towards the satisfaction of its needs. And at least some biological sciences (ethology, ecology, animal cognition, comparative psychology) may be construed as attempts to improve upon and systematize this ordinary mode of explanation. Acknowledging this point (as it seems to me McDowell does in effect in chapter six of Mind and World) could only have bulwarked his strategy for bringing out the naturalness of reason.

Regardless, the salient point is this. You may believe that McDowell doesn't succeed in resolving the dilemma he is concerned with. You may believe that this dilemma doesn't in fact speak to an important strand in post-Enlightenment epistemology. You may believe that McDowell's diagnosis of coherentism and the myth of the Given as unsatisfying responses to this dilemma is mistaken. If you have any of these beliefs, you are free to argue for their truth. What is pointless is to criticize McDowell's attempt to resolve his dilemma on the ground that it does not provide the materials for a satisfactory completion of a different philosophical project -- that of explaining how the rational "emerges" from the non-rational, with the need for such an explanation taken for granted.

The second misunderstanding I will discuss has to do with McDowell's claim that there is a kind of freedom involved in the exercise of a capacity for reason and judgment. This claim is very important to McDowell: his attraction to empiricism is a function of his conviction that we need to conceive experience as a constraint on the freedom involved in thought and judgment if we are to avoid an ultimately self-defeating picture of empirical thinking as "frictionless spinning in the void" (Mind and World, p. 11). Gaskin rejects the proposed link between judgment and freedom, and thus the entire motivation for McDowell's inquiry into experience. He does so because he interprets McDowell as holding that the formation of a judgment, even in the case of judgments based immediately on experience, involves a literal decision on the part of the subject. Gaskin takes that to be not only phenomenologically inaccurate, but epistemologically untenable: "Subjects are presented with appearances, and supposedly have to decide whether to take those appearances at 'face value': but how are they to decide that?" (p. 73)

Gaskin is obviously right to deny that there is a decision in the etiology of every judgment, at least if talk of a decision is meant to imply an episode of actively making up one's mind from among alternatives. But it takes only a bit of interpretive charity to see that McDowell's assertion of the link between judgment and freedom does not rest upon this absurd view. As he makes clear, he takes our freedom in judgment to be underwritten in part by a capacity to step back from the judgments one has, however they were formed, to evaluate the justification for them, and, if warranted, to revise them. "Active empirical thinking," he writes, "takes place under a standing obligation to reflect about the credentials of the putatively rational linkages that govern it" (Mind and World, p. 12). The ability to fulfill this obligation is an essential part of the "responsiveness to reasons" that McDowell takes to be "a good gloss on one notion of freedom" (Mind and World, p. xxiii). And obviously, this ability can be exercised in reflection on judgments based immediately on experience no less than on judgments of other kinds. Of course, McDowell may be wrong to take "responsiveness to reasons", so conceived, to constitute freedom in any meaningful sense. But again, one would need to have his position in view in order to critique it.

Even were he to see his way to a more charitable interpretation of the claim that responsiveness to reasons suffices for freedom, I suspect that Gaskin would reject it. For he is strongly committed to denying that there is any freedom involved in exercising the capacity for judgment. If freedom comes in anywhere, according to Gaskin, it is in action. He writes,

McDowell's persistent identification of what freedom we enjoy with freedom to make judgments is surely a mistake … [I]t is not … as thinkers who can base judgments on our experience that we enjoy freedom, if and to whatever extent we do, but as agents. (p. 72)

To his credit, Gaskin bites the bullet and endorses the natural corollary to this view: he denies that we are ever responsible for making the judgments we do. To the extent that we appear in ordinary life to hold people responsible for their judgments, what we are really doing is holding them responsible for their expressions of those judgments -- such expressions being, of course, actions: "the voluntary component of publicly made judgments, for which one may be held responsible, is not the bare formation of a judgment … but its communication" (pp. 72-73). Thus does Gaskin contrive to reject wholesale the notion of doxastic responsibility.

This disagreement between Gaskin and McDowell deserves extended treatment, but here I will just register a few salient points.

First, Gaskin's evident confidence that his view is on the side of intuition and commonsense is misplaced. Consider a person who forms negative judgments about people on the basis of scant evidence, or someone who is excessively pessimistic. Surely we might find it appropriate to hold such a person responsible, not merely for actions that flow from these judgments, but for the judgments themselves. For consider how natural it would be for someone who is aware of these tendencies in a person -- most obviously, the person herself -- to criticize and even blame her for the resultant judgments. Gaskin is committed to viewing such criticism and blame as misguided.

The second point concerns Gaskin's attempt to draw a sharp distinction between holding someone responsible for an expression of a judgment and holding him responsible for the judgment itself. Suppose it is my job to perform cost/benefit analyses of certain possible courses of action on the part of my organization, and then to report my findings. In an important such case, I form a judgment on the basis of an overhasty assessment of the evidence and thus recommend a course of action that has disastrous results -- results that could have been predicted given a more judicious and comprehensive assessment of the relevant considerations. It seems clear that in the absence of any excusing or exempting circumstances, I ought to be held responsible for my recommendation. Gaskin would take it that his view can accommodate this verdict: making a recommendation is, after all, an action, and as such something for which a person can legitimately be held responsible. But what, exactly, was blameworthy about this action? Was its blameworthy feature the fact that I communicated my judgment once I had settled upon it -- something which, given my position, I was obligated to do? Or does its blameworthiness lie rather in the fact that the judgment it reports was reached through an incompetent and careless process of judgment formation? The answer is surely the latter. But that means that in this case, Gaskin's accounting of the "components" of "publicly made judgments" for which we can and can't be held responsible gets things precisely backward.

Finally, we begin to get at the heart of the issue between Gaskin and McDowell if we ask: what could freedom in action be in the absence of freedom in judgment? Consider the notion of practical deliberation. Practical deliberation is naturally understood as a kind of reasoning and as such an exercise of the capacity for judgment. From Gaskin's perspective, it would follow that in practical deliberation we are not free, and a fortiori, that freedom and responsibility in action cannot be constituted by possession of that capacity. One wonders, then, what Gaskin could have in mind when he says that "it is plausible that the incompatibilist's search for a metaphysical freedom transcending the mere ability to make rational decisions among given options on the basis of … desires and motivations is unrealistic and ill-conceived" (p. 75). How can Gaskin countenance the possibility that freedom consists in an ability to make rational decisions given his denial that our capacity for reason is freely exercised? The answer must be that Gaskin does not regard making a "rational decision" as an exercise of reason, and as such not a case of practical deliberation as characterized above. For Gaskin, a "rational decision", unlike a judgment, must not be something that is formed through reflection on the reasons for and against it; whatever relationship Gaskin has in mind when he characterizes "rational decisions" as made "on the basis of … desires and motivations", he cannot mean that desires and motivations constitute or otherwise provide reasons for the agent. Freedom, for Gaskin, thus lies in our possession of a capacity to make "decisions" that are not based on reasons: a capacity to choose arbitrarily, as it were. This is a profoundly unattractive conception of freedom. But it is unsurprising that this is where one will end up if one recoils as violently as does Gaskin from the Kantian idea that "rational necessitation is not just compatible with freedom but constitutive of it" (Mind and World, p. 5).

The final misunderstanding I'll discuss concerns the background to McDowell's thesis, the defense of which occupies the first half of Mind and World, that the "tribunal" conception of experience, properly understood, entails that the contents of perceptual experiences are conceptual. To say that an experience's contents are conceptual, for McDowell, is to say that having that experience involves the exercise of conceptual capacities, where "it is essential to conceptual capacities … that they can be exploited in active thinking, thinking that is open to reflection about its own rational credentials" (Mind and World, p. 47). McDowell acknowledges that this is a "demanding" notion of the conceptual, and notes in particular that possession of conceptual capacities so conceived "implies self-consciousness" (Mind and World, p. 47).

Gaskin takes himself to agree with McDowell that "it is unacceptable to suppose that observational judgments might be rationally sensitive to the layout of the environment without requiring that that sensitivity be routed through individual experiences" (pp. 110-111), and furthermore, that an experience that plays this role must be "conceptual in the modest sense, that is, it is endowed with the (schematic) propositional content that such and such is the case" (p. 111). But, he writes,

The key point is this: from the agreed fact that experience is essentially conceptual in the modest sense … it does not follow that it is conceptual in the richer sense that its conceptual content (modestly understood) is necessarily available to a critical and reflective faculty possessed by the subject of the experience. (p. 118)

He claims that McDowell provides "no good reason" for requiring that experiences have conceptual content in the demanding, as opposed to modest, sense. And he suggests that limiting oneself to the modest requirement has a very desirable consequence: it enables us to ascribe perceptual experience to non-rational animals. That a dog is incapable of articulating or reflecting upon its experiences is no bar to assigning those experiences conceptual content, modestly understood: it suffices to justify that assignment that we can sensibly make 'that'-clause ascriptions such as, "The dog sees that the dish is empty."

Gaskin is aware that McDowell, in responding to a view relevantly similar to his, cites a "time-honoured connection between reason and discourse" (Mind and World, p. 165). More specifically, McDowell appeals to "the tie between reasons for which a subject thinks as she does, and reasons she can give for thinking that way" (Mind and World, p. 165). Gaskin grants that there is a connection between reason and discourse, but claims that

McDowell does nothing to show that the connection in question is anything other than general, to the effect that the genuine reasons must be expressible in discourse by someone (at some time). He does not show that what counts as a reason for an individual subject must be expressible or open to introspection by that very subject. (p. 122)

But surely the "tie" McDowell has in mind is perfectly obvious. When we explain a person's action or belief by citing her reasons for it, we assume that, in the normal case, the person is in a position to cite those reasons herself. Instances in which a person is opaque to herself -- in which she is ignorant of the reasons for which she does or believes something -- are treated as exceptional. The source of this assumption lies in the very nature of the reason-citing approach to explaining human thought and action. Such explanations operate by identifying why the belief or action in question seemed to the subject to be the thing to do or believe. The point is especially clear with respect to beliefs and actions that are the upshot of explicit episodes of deliberation. Giving the subject's reasons for a belief or action in such a case is a matter of summarizing the content of that deliberation, of identifying which reasons the subject found compelling in the course of making up her mind what to believe or do. But the point holds generally. When my friend Mike asks me what our mutual friend Rachel's reasons are for her expressed belief that Mike is a lousy driver, then whether or not Rachel arrived at that belief through an explicit course of deliberation, Mike expects me to identify reasons that Rachel takes there to be for that belief. And now all we need do to see our way to the "tie" McDowell asserts is to note that it is an instance of the general presumption of self-knowledge that, in the absence of indications to the contrary, we can assume that Rachel is aware of what she takes to be so, and thus in a position to give those reasons herself.

Of course, it doesn't follow that McDowell is correct to suppose that the contents of perceptual experiences are conceptual in the demanding sense. The point is only that what is controversial in McDowell's view is not the assertion of a "tie between reasons for which a subject thinks as she does, and reasons she can give for thinking that way". What is controversial, and for all that is said here, mistaken, is rather his view that we must take perceptual experiences to constitute reasons in just that sense -- reasons for which a subject thinks what she does.

I suspect that at least part of Gaskin's motivation for denying the existence of McDowell's "tie" is that he thinks it makes sense to speak of a non-linguistic animal, such as a dog, as having reasons for which it believes something. Whatever the merits of this thought, it is irrelevant. It matters for McDowell's purposes only that the tie obtain, as I have argued it obviously does, in the case of human beings. For it is only human beings that fall within the target range of the worry about freedom that generates the need to conceive experience as a tribunal.

There is a larger point to be made here. Commentators on Mind and World have a tendency to belabor their doubts about McDowell's refusal to credit non-judging animals with "experiences", "inner worlds", and the like. Gaskin devotes a chapter to doing so. Left to its own devices, this disagreement threatens to devolve into a terminological dispute. The actual topic of Mind and World is a philosophical puzzle that, by definition, does not apply to animals that lack a capacity for judgment. Here talk of a capacity for judgment must be understood in a rich enough sense to support the ascription of freedom, and that will surely require, as McDowell supposes, capacities for deliberation, reflection and self-consciousness. McDowell's treatment of perceptual experience has no other purpose but to help with his attempt to dissolve a philosophical puzzle that can arise in thinking about a capacity for judgment so understood. It follows that strictly speaking, McDowell does not need to maintain that all experience has conceptual content. He need maintain only that the perceptual experience of creatures with a capacity for judgment has conceptual content, thus leaving open the prospect of assigning "content" to the "experiences" of non-judging animals. I'm not sure if McDowell would agree, but about this matter it strikes me that Wittgenstein's advice, "Say what you choose, so long as it does not prevent you from seeing the facts," is particularly apposite.

There is a great deal more to Gaskin's critique; full coverage would require a very long article. A lot of what Gaskin has to say has interest quite independently of whether and how it bears upon McDowell's views. Gaskin has thought hard about a range of challenging topics -- perception, content, knowledge, singular thought, reference -- and he has insightful and suggestive things to say about them. The book repays close reading.

So far as the interpretation of Mind and World goes, the moral seems to me to be that any criticism of the book that fails to keep its stated aims and methods in view is bound to bypass its target. That is not, of course, to say that those aims and methods are beyond criticism. Again, one may deny that McDowell successfully resolves the puzzle he is concerned with. One may reject his attempts to locate the epistemological views he discusses in relation to that puzzle. One may dispute his contention that the puzzle reflects a significant strand in the history of epistemology and the philosophy of mind. One may even find oneself so unmoved by the puzzle of interest to McDowell that any attempt to find food for thought in his writings on the puzzle inevitably leads one to try to interpret his remarks as contributions to philosophical projects of a rather different sort. As this is likely to lead to frustration, one might do better in this case to put down Mind and World and read something else.