Experience Embodied: Early Modern Accounts of the Human Place in Nature

Experience Embodied Early Modern Accounts Of The Human Place In Nature

Anik Waldow, Experience Embodied: Early Modern Accounts of the Human Place in Nature, Oxford University Press, 2020, 312pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190086114.

Reviewed by Charles Wolfe, Université de Toulouse


This very clearly written and argued study takes as its theme what the author, Anik Waldow, calls “embodied experience” in early modern philosophy, focusing on some classic figures (Descartes, Locke, Hume, Kant) and some less classic ones, although not too far off the perimeter (Rousseau, Herder). The chapters existed in an earlier form as independent articles on individual figures, but are carefully rewritten and combined here. This combination of names shows, at least to those with some interest in overcoming textbook categorizations, that Waldow neatly rejects the rationalism/empiricism distinction, calling her decision to include Kant and Descartes in a book on experience “part of the critical effort to reveal the serious deficiency of the post-Kantian distinction between empiricism and rationalism” (10). But what then is embodied experience? This is an intriguing notion, which clearly bears some relation to that of embodiment overall.

While some of us, including this reviewer, would focus (indeed, have focused) on aspects of our corporeal, biological nature and how this intersects with early modern philosophical themes (see e.g., Wolfe and Gal eds. 2010, Smith ed. 2017)  for Waldow the issue is, as she states on the first page, the problem faced by a number of thinkers of this period: “because of their embodiment,” human beings are to be conceived as “similarly responsive and causally determined as other nonhuman animals that mechanically receive and process perceptual stimuli impinging on their bodies.” The implication is that we need to take seriously “the human place in nature, given that nature was traditionally conceived as the realm in which cause and effect rule,” which means a vision of human action that runs counter to the traditional picture in which humans “are able to use reason and will to distance themselves from the immediate causal im­pulse elicited by their bodily responses” (1): in other words, the traditional understanding of humans as self-movers and self-determiners.

The general claim can be put in a short sentence: for there to be experience there has to be a body (as some philosophers might have responded to Putnam’s once-celebrated brain-in-a-vat thought experiment in the 1970s). Or, in Waldow’s words, “Experience thus understood is neither internal nor external, but works at the interface between inside and outside: it connects our being and acting in the world with the fact that we have sensations, thoughts, and feelings” (4). But rather than investigate the role of the body—of sensation, affect, appetites, drives, instincts and how we belong or do not belong to the physical universe of bodies overall—Waldow is interested in tying this notion of experience to a notion of humans as self-transforming, social agents: agents whose experience is tied to their self-transcendence of their basic naturalness. (This leads to micro-debates in which she defends, e.g., a more ‘social’ reading of Locke on personhood, with Lenz contra Thiel.) This experiential dimension, Waldow claims, comes to fruition in the eighteenth century with Hume, Rousseau and Herder.

In this sense, whether she is discussing Humean sympathy, Lockean pedagogy, or Rousseau’s and Herder’s insistence on our intrinsically historical identity, Waldow’s theme very strongly resembles what thinkers in a more Hegelo-Marxist tradition would call second nature; Waldow’s book could have been subtitled (with a nod to Hirschman’s The Passions and the Interests) Early Modern Arguments for Second Nature Before its Triumph.

Waldow’s analysis focuses primarily on the first term in the title, namely, experience, and her overall claim is that to experience oneself is to experience oneself as an agent acting and interacting in the world. She reconstructs this as follows: in Descartes, “the epistemological agenda of [the Meditations],” she writes, “unfolds against the background of broader practical-moral considerations that directly impact on how we live and experience ourselves in our interactions with the world and others” (43). In Locke, she highlights what she calls the “worldly dimension” of his “experience-grounded philo­sophical program”: as regards e.g., personal identity, “what matters for the conception of the self as a person is not simply how we relate to our thoughts from within our own consciousness: that is, as minds that constitute their personal identity by being conscious of themselves, which is the account that Locke develops in the second edition of the Essay” (54). Moreover, for Locke sensu Waldow, “this awareness makes accessible to us, and renders significant, the manner in which we are entrenched in the world as agents who can project their responsibilities into the future where they will be held responsible for what they did” (55). It is in that sense that “Lockean selves are moral selves”: they “emerge in the intersubjective sphere where they develop a sense of esteem and learn to understand themselves as agents who are responsible for their doings” (92).

The part of the analysis of Locke that seemed most original to me concerned his thoughts on education. Take, for instance, Locke’s attitude towards corporeal punishment. It poses a basic question with regards to his overall or at least intermittent commitment to a hedonistic motivational psychology. Waldow doesn’t quite put it that way, but the question is obvious: since one major strand of Locke’s understanding of action and behavior is hedonistic, given that he considers pleasure and pain to be the major triggers therein, how can he reject corporeal punishment in education? For he writes, “Beating then, and all Sorts of slavish and corporeal Punishments, are not the Discipline fit to be used in the Education of those we would have wise, good, and ingenuous Men” (Some Thoughts on Education, cit. Waldow, 58). And it is not just punishment but rewards, e.g., sweets and other treats, which Locke judges harshly: “What prin­ciple of Vertue do you lay in a Child, if you will redeem his Desire of one Pleasure, by the proposal of another? This is but to enlarge his Appetite, and instruct it to wander. If a Child cries for an unwholesome and dangerous Fruit, you purchase his quiet by giving him a less hurtful Sweet-meat” (ibid., cited and discussed by Waldow at 58–59). The solution lies in Locke’s notion of esteem, which has a reflexive dimension absent in mere simple reward-and-punishment; as the child grows, it ideally acquires a desire for esteem and a dislike for disgrace. I say ‘reflexive’ because what is centrally at issue for Locke is that the child develops a sense of itself as “a person with morally evaluable qualities” (61). Rather than threatening or bribing a child, we should seek to develop its reflexive relation to these qualities. The emphasis on ethical and practical motivations in Locke is not new, of course, and I’ll just note that the absence of Sorana Corneanu’s work here is surprising given the topic (see Corneanu 2011).

Waldow’s discussion of Hume aims to show that in his work, sophisticated cognitive capacities arise and evolve as a result of complex experiential patterns (16). Experience in Hume, she argues, “refers us to the history of a person’s perceptual engagements over the course of her life” (111), engagements which include “the perception of situations exhibiting the regularities Hume’s general rules are supposed to capture” (112). Hume’s notion of sympathy is crucial here, as a development of what Waldow considers a Lockean idea (in Locke’s pedagogical theory especially) that experiential learning and an en­gagement with varied social contexts are indispensable resources in human development. For sympathy brings together both basic perceptual capacities (shared with animals), namely sympathetic mechanisms that are causally triggered by the expressive behavior of others, and an evolving dimension that develops when we are confronted with sufficiently complex experiential contexts. Thereby, human beings become reflective moral creatures that are able to manage, reorganize, and eval­uate complex constellations of ideas (12, 129). When engaged in this reflective work, the mind no longer simply responds to its experiences, but uses them as a resource in the critical analysis of what confronts it when engaging with the world and other people. As has been much discussed in the Humean literature (which Waldow abundantly discusses—indeed this work is at times perhaps over-generous in its discussion of secondary sources), this makes sympathy inseparably natural and normative.

The experiential dimension in Hume is also, famously, experimental, in the sense that Hume influentially described his project right in the subtitle to the Treatise, as introducing “the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects” (cit. 97). But ‘experiments’ refers to a genuinely human science, namely, “a cautious observation of human life,” of “men’s behaviour in company, in affairs and in their pleasures” (Treatise, Introduction, cit. 97). The further implication, which Waldow teases out, is that introducing the experimental method into the domain of morals actually means expanding our moral horizon: on Hume’s account according to Waldow, “sympathetically taking in and reflectively surveying a range of different samples of moral practices and sensibilities are measures that give us ‘sounder reasoning and larger experience’” (A Dialogue, cit. 124).

Beyond Lockean pedagogy and Humean sympathy, the idea that Rousseau and Herder will really move to top billing involves fully rethinking our common contrasts between what counts as ‘natural’ and what counts as a product of social, cultural, and historical influences (99). Starting with Rousseau (and, Waldow suggests, with Hume, but this is more controversial), this becomes not just an account of ‘who we are’ and how we function, but of ‘how we can evolve’—ultimately as historical beings, whose identity is de-naturalized or supra-naturalized through reason and language, in Herder. The nature/nurture distinction is of little use for understanding the authors discussed, for natural capacities require complex social interaction to function and be active; in Humean terms, artifice is a key component of moral judgment and in Rousseauean terms, morality has no place in nature (hence the importance of republican morals). This harks back to Waldow’s discussion of Locke on education, which stressed that as humans are responsive to their environments, it is important “to create those kinds of environments through which they can learn to develop into the enlightened minds they are supposed to be” (162); hence also the importance of history (for Rousseau, Hume and Herder) and of theatre, “often seen as providing a certain range of emotional experiences through which the audiences could develop themselves and refine their capacity for critical thinking” (162).

Thus another part of Waldow’s discussion which is certainly original in terms of Anglophone early modern philosophical scholarship is her inclusion of the controversy between Rousseau and D’Alembert over the possibility of bringing Voltaire’s plays to Geneva. Rousseau attacked D’Alembert’s proposal to do so (in the article “Geneva” of the Encyclopédie), writing angrily to D’Alembert that “Theatres and Drama,” “in any little Republic, and es­pecially in Geneva, weaken the State” (cit. 134). Inspired by Corneille and the seventeenth-century movement of return to principles from classical antiquity, Voltaire’s plays sought to renew a theatrical tradition “that takes the emo­tional susceptibility of human nature as the main principle structuring moral education” (135). What this indicates for Waldow is that many of the key themes around which the French Enlightenment revolved “were directly connected with the Lockean and Humean conception of self-formation through experiential learning, because what lies at the heart of the Enlightenment debate is a concern about human development and the progress of the species as a whole” (131).

But additionally, she shows that the experiential emphasis coming out of Locke and Hume and building in what I might term a ‘historicized’[1] direction in Rousseau, Herder and Kant (whose status in the book is not entirely clear), leads to another key idea: that “reason, and its use in the formulation of well-formed judgments, should not be thought of as standing in opposition to our embodied sensibilities and the affective responses they trigger”; rather, “the capacity to reason should be understood as growing out of the experiences our affective sensibilities enable in our interactions with the world and other people” (131). This is a central motif in Waldow’s analysis of Herder, for whom “reason counts as an organizational principle whose characteristic mark is to integrate our various cognitive, affective, and imaginative capacities with one another” (175).

This new concept of reason in Herder “not only emerges out of the forces of nature, but keeps developing in communication with the dynamics of concrete environmental conditions that include natural as well as social and cultural factors” (14). Further, it is an affective view of reason: “even after reason has emerged basic affective and imaginative pro­cesses remain constitutively involved in the formation of reasoned thought, and ought to be so, in order to guard against experience-detached, specu­lative metaphysics” (166), not some kind of static recording faculty but, in Frederick Beiser’s terms, “an active self-realising energy” (Beiser, cit. 170). But importantly, this new concept of reason is also linked to a new emphasis on language: for Herder, “our first words are drawn from the sounds we hear when interacting with the world” (170); “Herder’s account is ultimately grounded in the idea that reason develops out of the forces of nature,” through language (222).

Herder’s improvement of Humean sympathy, as Waldow presents it, is novel precisely because it is tied to an account of language acquisition (that also involves central aspects of Locke’s and Rousseau’s reflections on the connection between language and thought). For Herder, she writes, “an affective capacity that enables us to connect with the language of differently situated others can become instrumental in understanding the fac­tual reality impacting on human experience at a given time and place” (13). It seems almost obvious once we’ve read it: that sympathy with others requires language. Herder’s upgrade of Humean sympathy builds on his theory of language and of reason: “by sympathetically connecting with the language of differently situated persons, it is therefore possible to render rationally accessible to us what constitutes the reality of their lives” (188). As a minor quibble, Waldow makes statements about Herder’s response to Hume which can be a bit puzzling, as no textual evidence is provided, e.g., she speaks of Herder’s “uptake of Hume’s account of sympathy” (165) and how his concept of Einfühlung takes up important aspects thereof (183), and then quotes Herder on feeling—but it is not clear why this should be Humean in provenance.[2]

In the final chapters, Waldow turns to Kant and his anthropology. The final contrast is with Kant, because he presents reason as standing outside of nature: an empirical investigation of human life and experience cannot ever grasp the core features of personhood, including our ‘nature’ (perhaps an unfortunate term here) as rational and free beings. Anthropology as a science can be of ‘pragmatic’ value for Kant, but cannot yield transcendentally valid insights, which require an “a priori methodology” (194, 224). Kant’s treatment of human life rests on an implicit methodological dualism between two sets of laws, as Waldow puts it (223), the laws of nature and the laws of reason: an “aprioristic methodology.”

All the other authors discussed in this book allowed for a certain worldliness of reason, including in its overlap with or reflexive relation to affectivity. Herder in particular maximizes the value of an anthropological approach to humans, who he strongly separates from animals but nevertheless views as creatures to be studied developmentally in their natural and historical conditions and contexts of emergence. Notably, reason is much more ‘within’ Nature for Herder than for Kant, given his developmentalist account of its origin, including the idea of a shift in human posture towards the upright position (197), and its rather unfortunate fixation on humanity’s Mängelwesen as contrasted with the ‘world-poor’ animals, reminiscent of twentieth-century philosophical anthropology.

Waldow presents the (standard) opposition between Herder and Kant but suggests a more ‘Herderian’ reading of Kant, in which anthropology “can be used to orient the sciences in such a way that they are able to serve the needs of embodied human beings who find themselves embedded in the constraints of an empirically instantiated world” (228). More bluntly, she asserts that Kant’s “experience-based anthropology” can “provide a foundation for the sciences” (228). This is a noticeably different judgment from that found in recent prominent works such as those of John Zammito or Stephen Gaukroger; Waldow proposes a less foundationalist Kant. Compare Gaukroger, who observed that it is remarkable “not only how poorly integrated [Kant’s] anthropology is into his critical philosophy, but how little he is able to do with it” (Gaukroger 2016, 214).

In the end, Kant is something like the wall in a crash-test for the experimental-experiential thread of Waldow’s analysis. She doesn’t deny that Kant did not adjust the critical philosophy to suit the success of the new experimental sciences (as brilliantly detailed in Zammito’s work: Zammito 2018). But she argues that faced with this growing complexity of experience-based studies of human beings (notably in the Scottish Enlightenment science of human nature, moving towards social science), Kant “came to the conclusion that the Janus-faced nature of the human being justifies a multiplicity of methods and disciplines: those that approach the human being empirically and prag­matically, as in anthropology, and those that investigate it theoretically and metaphysically in the analysis of the concepts through which we can con­ceive of ourselves as intellectual and moral agents” (258–259).

The new vision of reason that Waldow lays out, coming to fruition notably in Herder and Kant, raises the important question of the scope and method of the new experimental sciences and “the endeavor of rendering the world, and the human place within that world, ‘scientifically’ explicable” (193). As Hume nicely put it, “The Rhine flows north, the Rhone south; yet both spring from the same moun­tain, and are also actuated, in their opposite directions, by the same princi­ples of gravity. The different inclinations in the ground, on which they run, cause all the difference in their causes” (A Dialogue, cit. 119). Given the indication of the analogy that moral principles are uniform, while varied historical influences explain the diversity of moral practices, the question of what a science of human behavior can and should be is indeed central. Waldow hints at but does not develop the theme of the regularity of human action as a basis for behavioral or social science (without this regularity reducing to natural causality), something on display in prominent authors like Montesquieu and differently, Helvétius or Diderot. In the background of such ideas is Spinoza, who is quite absent from this study; Spinozist influences in a variety of eighteenth-century authors play out exactly this theme in a somewhat different manner (Douglas 2019, Wolfe 2007).

Waldow’s book gives us a systematic, comparative (but not especially contextual) analysis of the development of the theme of reason as “the very faculty that gives rise to the possibility of human freedom” (233), from Descartes to Kant. Some of its analyses of individual figures are stronger than others, and one might have hoped for more ‘synthetic’ or comparative analysis—the part on Herder and Kant feels quite different from the rest of the book, with Rousseau somewhere in the middle, and Descartes, Locke and Hume on the other side. But Waldow’s study is filled with careful, sustained, thought-provoking analyses that will be useful both in scholarly terms and in advanced teaching of texts like Descartes’ Meditations, Locke’s Essay (ideally if coupled with Thoughts on Education), but also Herder’s uniquely titled This Too a Philosophy of History for the Formation of Humanity. It is a convincing story and one that obliges us to revisit some classics in an untraditional vein.


Corneanu, S. 2011. Regimens of the Mind. Boyle, Locke, and the Early Modern ‘Cultura Animi’ Tradition. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Douglas, A. 2019. “Spinozism in Social Science,” in Encyclopedia of Early Modern Philosophy and the Sciences, eds. D. Jalobeanu, C.T. Wolfe. Cham: Springer https://doi.org/10.1007/978-3-319-20791-9_461-1

Forster, M. 2018. Herder's Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press

Gaukroger, S. 2016. The Natural and the Human: Science and the Shaping of Modernity 1739– 1841. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Smith, J.E.H., ed. 2017. Embodiment (Oxford Philosophical Concepts). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wolfe, C.T. 2007. “Determinism/Spinozism in the Radical Enlightenment: the cases of Anthony Collins and Denis Diderot,” International Review of Eighteenth-Century Studies 1: 37–51

Wolfe, C.T., Gal, O. (eds.) 2010. The Body as Object and Instrument of Knowledge. Embodied Empiricism in Early Modern Science. Dordrecht: Springer

Zammito, J. 2018. The Gestation of German Biology. Philosophy and Physiology from Stahl to Schelling. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.


[1] Waldow portrays Herder as, one might say, moving Hume ‘upwards’, with a “sympathy-driven historiographical method that focuses on historical agents and their specific way of thinking, feeling, and experiencing the world, responds to this insight. It invites us to use our own minds to latch on to the particular combination of social, cultural, and natural causes present in the historical situation under consideration” (221).

[2] For Waldow, Herder follows Hume (185); now, this reviewer is by no means fluent in Herder, but it seems more obvious that Herder is influenced by Kant, including the pre-critical Kant (as indicated in Forster 2018). Herder’s mentions of Hume (and Voltaire in the same paragraph) seem more concerned with our historical nature.