Experiences of Depression: A Study in Phenomenology

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Matthew Ratcliffe, Experiences of Depression: A Study in Phenomenology, Oxford University Press, 2015, 318pp., $59.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199608973.

Reviewed by Katherine Withy, Georgetown University


This volume collects Matthew Ratcliffe's work from the last five years on depression and existential feeling, offering a rich and compelling phenomenological interpretation of the variety and unity of experiences of depression. Ratcliffe's interpretation is informed by and in dialogue with not only historical and contemporary phenomenology, but also philosophy of mind and philosophy of emotion, as well as psychiatry and psychology. The book is an important contribution to phenomenology in general and to the phenomenology of mood disorder in particular, and it provides those who suffer from depression -- as well as those who care for them -- a powerful new way to understand and express their experiences.

The primary challenge facing a phenomenology of depression is that depressive experiences are hard to describe adequately -- and any description that a sufferer does produce seems to lend itself to being misunderstood. In good phenomenological style, Ratcliffe takes this challenge as a clue. He argues that the mistake is to try to understand and talk about depressive experience in terms of ordinary intentional states -- for example, as experiencing intense negative emotion, or as making certain types of judgements about the world. Depression is not an intentional state or set of intentional states; it must be understood instead in terms of what he has previously called 'existential feeling'. Existential feeling is our sense of reality and our sense of ourselves as here, now, engaging with things and interacting with others. Ratcliffe argues that it is a pre-intentional, embodied sense of belonging to a shared world. It is in part because existential feeling is pre-intentional, and so not generally an object of conscious experience or thought, that it is easy to overlook and difficult to talk about. It is for this reason, too, that depression and other shifts in existential feeling demand a specifically phenomenological treatment.

To give us a sense for the phenomenon of existential feeling, Ratcliffe quotes his own evocative list of descriptions of existential feeling from his Feelings of Being: Psychiatry and the Sense of Reality (Oxford University Press, 2008):

People sometimes talk of feeling alive, dead, distant, detached, dislodged, estranged, isolated, otherworldly, indifferent to everything, overwhelmed, suffocated, cut off, lost, disconnected, out of sorts, not oneself, out of touch with things, out of it, not quite with it, separate, in harmony with things, at peace with things or part of things. There are references to feelings of unreality, heightened existence, surreality, familiarity, unfamiliarity, strangeness, isolation, emptiness, belonging, being at home in the world, being at one with things, significance, insignificance and the list goes on. People also sometimes report that 'things just don't feel right', 'I'm not with it today', 'I just feel a bit removed from it all at the moment', 'I feel out of it' or 'it feels strange'. (p. 68, cited p. 36)

In Feelings of Being, Ratcliffe presented existential feeling primarily in terms of Heideggerian mood, as the way in which we find ourselves in the world. In Experiences of Depression, he relies on Husserl, Merleau-Ponty and Sartre. In Chapter 2, Ratcliffe adopts from Husserl and Merleau-Ponty the vocabulary of 'horizon' and 'world', which he uses to further interpret existential feeling as (part of?) a 'possibility space'. A possibility space is a contexture of ways in which things can be significant and so a set of interrelated possible ways for us to engage with things (in the broadest possible sense of 'things'). There are various kinds of possible ways to experience things, and Ratcliffe suggests that these can be characterised in terms of different perceptual modalities, different degrees of determinacy or certainty, different relationships to agency, different ways of mattering, and differences in interpersonal accessibility (p. 52). But rather than elaborate on the nature of the possibility space directly, he seeks to understand it by looking to experiences in which it is reconfigured -- that is, experiences in which our existential feeling changes.

While we each have just the one existential feeling, there are variety of possible existential feelings, and which one we have can change over time. Ratcliffe calls such a change an 'existential change' (although he does count change in existential feeling as itself an existential feeling (p. 31)). In existential change, the possibility space is reconfigured. It is as such a reconfiguration that Ratcliffe interprets depression. He argues that depression is a shift in -- sometimes experienced as a loss of -- the kinds of possibilities that are alive for us. In particular, the possibility of meaningful events or projects is eroded or lost. It is not that the depressed person does not anticipate any particular meaningful events occurring -- that nothing is significant right now but something in the future might be. It is that significant events are no longer possible. The very possibility of significant events has gone or faded.

A change so fundamental can be experienced and expressed in a variety of different ways. Ratcliffe works closely with first-person depression narratives and questionnaire responses in order to explore the experiences of depression from different perspectives: bodily experience (Chapter 3), loss of hope (Chapter 4), the depth of the change and feelings of guilt (Chapter 5), loss of agency (Chapter 6), the experience of time (Chapter 7), and relationships with other people (Chapter 8). (Since these chapters describe the same phenomenon from different perspectives, and since each is based on a recently published article, there is a certain sense of repetition in the text overall. The benefit is that each chapter can easily be read on its own, and many would make terrific readings for courses on phenomenology, moods, moral psychology, or similar topics).

Ratcliffe's interpretation shows that most (but, it turns out, not all) experiences that are or might be diagnosed as depression can be understood as changes in existential feeling. But his interpretation further reveals within this unity a heterogeneity that psychology and psychiatry have overlooked. This is why the plural in the title is important: there are many different existential changes that meet the diagnostic criteria for depression, and so many experiences of depression. Ratcliffe distinguishes four potential dimensions of depressive experience: the loss of significant events (which is not an existential change but which can be diagnosed as depression), the loss of the possibility of significant events, the loss of all practical significance (either just for oneself, or for everyone), and a sense of passivity in the face of a threat. Different combinations of these elements produce different experiences of depression. This variety, along with the distinction between existential change and non-existential change, is not captured by the current DSM criteria for depression or by other diagnostic tools such as the Beck Hopelessness Scale. While Ratcliffe does not overstep his bounds by making concrete suggestions about how depressive experiences ought to be classified and diagnosed, his interpretation brings the complexity of the phenomenon into view for those who do concern themselves with classification and diagnosis.

By the end of the book, Ratcliffe has also begun to work out the logic of the possible combinations of the various aspects of depressive experiences, and in this he makes a start on developing our understanding of the nature and structure of the possibility space itself. Indeed, the book has much to contribute to our understanding of human experience in general. In addition to interpreting depressive experience specifically, Ratcliffe explores the notion of the 'depth' of emotions (Chapter 5), the phenomenology of agency and free will (Chapter 6), the lived experience of time and its relationship to our projects (Chapter 7), what it is like to experience others as persons (Chapter 8), and the phenomenology of empathy (Chapter 9). These discussions are of wide-ranging interest well beyond the phenomenology of moods and mood disorders.

The penultimate chapter argues for a positive theory of empathy as an irreducible second-personal intentional experience, and it reveals that Ratcliffe's phenomenological method is a form of what he calls 'radical empathy'. Let me conclude by briefly discussing this method. The phrase 'radical empathy' echoes the depressed person's 'radical hopelessness', which Ratcliffe discusses in Chapter 4 as the opposite of Jonathan Lear's concept of 'radical hope'. Ratcliffe argues that to be empathetic is to be attentive to another person's experience and open to and curious about ways in which that experience might differ phenomenologically from one's own. Empathy is radical when its object is not another's intentional experience but their pre-intentional existential feeling or possibility space. So, radical empathy "involves engaging with someone else's experiences, rather than one's own, while at the same time suspending the usual assumption that both parties share the same space of possibilities" (p. 242). This suspension is something like the phenomenological reduction, or what Ratcliffe calls 'taking up the phenomenological stance'. While phenomenology can take up this stance and treat experiences third-personally, if it does work with first-person reports -- as Ratcliffe does here -- then it is radically empathetic.

Ratcliffe makes a compelling case for his phenomenology as radical empathy, but there is still some room to further clarify precisely what radical empathy involves and how the language of phenomenology is being deployed to characterise it. In particular, it could be more clear what the phenomenological stance is and how it relates to existential feelings. As in Feelings of Being, he bases the phenomenological stance on Husserl's epoché, which he defines as "a suspension or bracketing of the 'natural attitude' of believing in the existence of the world" (p. 19). Ratcliffe plausibly suggests that this 'natural attitude' is our existential feeling. However, it seems that what he asks us to suspend or bracket is not our existential feeling per se. This is, I think, as it should be: a total surrender of existential feeling would render intentional experience impossible, and a partial suspension of it would amount to an experience of derealisation. Instead, Ratcliffe asks us to suspend or bracket our assumption that everyone else has the same existential feeling or inhabits the same possibility space that we do (p. 242). But why must we suspend or bracket this assumption each time rather than simple correcting it in a single stroke? Something like a suspending or bracketing is methodologically necessary only if the assumption that we all share the same existential feeling belongs essentially to what it is to have an existential feeling. Does it? It is not clear to me. But if it does, then depression cannot be an existential feeling, since -- as Ratcliffe shows very clearly -- depressive experiences involve a sense that one is living in a different world from others.

While there is surely a case to be made that at least some existential feelings do involve assuming that they are shared, it seems to me that this case would have to hinge on what it means to have a sense of a 'shared world', and this opens up a new set of problems. 'World' here could be the technical term referring to the possibility space, in which case to have an existential feeling is indeed to have a sense that we all share that existential feeling. Or, 'world' could refer to all the stuff that is the object of our existential feeling -- to what our existential feeling is about -- in which case to have an existential feeling is to have a sense that we're all here in the midst of things together. But having this sense is consistent with taking us all to have different existential feelings, and so to be in the midst of things in different ways. The problem in the background is that 'world' is used both as another word for existential feeling or the possibility space, and as the grammatical object of the existential feeling. In any case, the point is that there is room for more theoretical work to be done on clarifying the phenomenological terms and method that we are using to talk about existential feeling.

Still, such phenomenological research is not necessary for being radically empathetic, since one can simply adopt the phenomenological stance -- even without any philosophical training (p. 249). Adopting this stance amounts to "the acknowledgement that there is an experientially constituted sense of reality and belonging, coupled with a commitment to studying it further using whatever resources are at our disposal" (p. 21). That anyone can do this is good news for sufferers of depression and those who care for them, since it promises that anyone can come to better understand depressive experience. Further, Ratcliffe argues that taking up this stance while in dialogue with a depressed person might even help that person, since such radical empathy can begin to rebuild some of the interactive possibilities that are lost or degraded in depression.

Even in the absence of radical empathy, I imagine that a depressed person would be helped simply by reading this book. It offers a way of thinking and talking about depressive experience that seems adequate to the phenomenon, and this is something that many have long struggled to find.