Experiencing Time

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Simon Prosser, Experiencing Time, Oxford University Press, 2016, 221pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198748946.

Reviewed by  Ian Phillips, St. Anne's College, University of Oxford


Our experience of time has long puzzled theorists from very different perspectives: psychologists and physicists, metaphysicians and philosophers of mind. Combining his own perspectives of metaphysician and philosopher of mind with a commendable appreciation of relevant physics and psychology, Simon Prosser offers a rich and absorbing treatment in his latest book. Its scope and clear style also make it an excellent, albeit strongly opinionated, introduction to the field.

Experiencing Time is, first and foremost, an attack on the A-theory of time and so a defence of the B-theory. This terminology and opposition comes from J. M. E. McTaggart (1908) who discusses how we can either order events by describing them as (more or less) past, present or (more or less) future (the A-series), or by describing them as standing in certain precedence relations to each other, such as earlier than, later than or co-occurrent with one another (the B-series). According to B-theorists, the B-series suffices to describe temporal reality. Thus, all times are accorded equal status, and change is treated simply as a matter of objects having different properties (or parts) relative to different times. In contrast, the A-theorist insists that we cannot adequately describe the facts without recognizing their orientation towards a privileged time: the present. The A-theorist also repudiates the B-theorist's account of change, insisting that true change, or what Prosser calls "temporal passage," involves a change in the orientation of the facts, or (on presentist views) simply in the facts themselves.

Prosser sets out these issues in chapter one which offers a helpful tour of the metaphysics of time. He notes various complications with the neat dichotomy just sketched, and comments on three common arguments for the B-theory. McTaggart's argument that the A-series is incoherent is (unsurprisingly) given short shrift; arguments from relativity and the unintelligibility of the notion that time passes at some rate are considered much more sympathetically.

One might naturally wonder what all this has to do with our experience of time. Chapter two opens with Prosser's answer: "The major reason for believing that time passes [i.e. that there is A-theoretic change] is that experience seems to tell us so" (p. 22). Indeed, as later becomes clear, in Prosser's view, the notion of "temporal passage" at the heart of the A-theory is so closely tied to experience that, cut-off from it, the A-theory would be "without enough content to offer a genuine alternative to the B-theory" (p. 23). These contentions are foundational for Prosser's project. For that project commences (in chapter two) by arguing against the A-theory on the ground that the passage of time cannot possibly be experienced, a result which is said to deprive the A-theorist of any contentful notion of passage. The project then turns to a detailed investigation of the various ways in which, despite this, experience strongly "disposes us to believe that there is such a phenomenon as the passage of time" (p. 165), a diagnostic task motivated by Prosser's view that, experience aside, it is obscure "why anyone should ever have been an A-theorist in the first place" (p. 59).

Prosser devotes four chapters to extirpating the A-theory, experiential root by experiential root. In chapter three, he argues that expressions such as "past" and "present" are easily misunderstood as attributing A-theoretic properties. In chapter four, he develops a sophisticated account of what it is to experience time as passing at a certain rate -- and in particular of what is going on when time seems to pass more or less quickly. In chapter six, Prosser proposes that change is experienced as dynamic because experience misrepresents its objects as enduring (that is, as being wholly present at any time they exist and strictly retaining their identities over time) as opposed to perduring (that is, as having different temporal parts at different times -- or, on stage theory, as standing in special relations to other instantaneous objects). Finally, in chapter seven, Prosser considers the broader phenomenology of "moving through time," and of freedom and the open future.

There is a great deal of interest in these various discussions, as there is in the largely independent chapter five in which Prosser defends a "dynamic snapshot theory" of temporal experience which rejects the traditionally dominant idea that experience has a specious present.[1] However, as valuable as these discussions are, it is worth asking whether Prosser is right that experience is the vital fountainhead of the A-theory. As evidence, Prosser offers a half dozen stock quotations from A-theorists (Arthur Eddington, M. M. Schuster, G. N. Schlesinger etc.), implying that there are "countless" others. Yet, as Prosser notes (p. 22, fn. 1), these same passages "have been quoted many times," largely by B-theorists. As a result, one wonders whether they are as representative as Prosser presumes, or instead whether they represent a vulnerable excrescence in A-theoretic thinking that B-theorists have chosen to seize upon.

Such suspicions are emboldened if we recall that McTaggart, who first clearly articulates the thought that the A-series (albeit in his view it is incoherent) is "essential to the reality of time" (1908, p. 458), does not make this claim on the basis of experience. McTaggart considers the appeal to experience but suggests that it is not very forceful since "It is possible . . . that [the fact we observe events as forming an A-series] is merely subjective . . . a constant illusion of our minds" (ibid). What convinces McTaggart is rather the thought that time involves change and that "Without the A series . . . there would be no change" (p. 461; likewise McTaggart 1927: §§307-24). From this perspective the fundamental issue is whether the B-theorist has an adequate account of change and not how (or even whether) we experience it.

Contemporary A-theorists -- many of whom conceive of themselves first-and-foremost as presentists -- also do not standardly place significant weight on experience. Many rather regard their view as the proper articulation of our general common-sense commitments about time and existence. Thus, Dean Zimmerman:

My reason for believing the A-theory is utterly banal (some . . . will want to say "insipid"): it is simply part of commonsense that the past and future are less real than the present; that the difference between events and things that exist at present, and ones that do not, goes much deeper than the difference between events and things near where I am and ones that are spatially far away -- in Australia, for example. (2008, p. 221)

See also Ned Markosian (2004) and T. M. Crisp (2003), and, indeed, even Tim Maudlin (2002, p. 237). In fact, Prosser himself writes: "There seems little doubt that the A-theory best captures the way most of us think of the world prior to philosophical reflection on the matter." (p. 1) Of course, it is a good question whether these claims about common-sense are right and, if so, how far they take us.[2] But it is unclear how threatened an A-theorist so motivated will feel by Prosser's arguments against the possibility of perceiving temporal passage. Furthermore, if one can after all fathom "why anyone should ever have been an A-theorist in the first place" (p. 59) without appeal to our experience of "temporal passage", then it will be open to the B-theorist simply to deny that there is any feature of our experience which misrepresents temporal reality (a view recently defended by Natalja Deng 2013a, b and Christoph Hoerl 2014, though given short shrift by Prosser). Taking this line, the B-theorist can focus instead on defending the adequacy of their account of change.

No doubt, some A-theorists do claim that we experience temporal passage. And it is of no small interest to their debate with B-theorists if Prosser is right that such experiences are impossible (whether or not it follows that the A-theory is unintelligible). Prosser offers two related arguments for this conclusion: his detector and multi-detector arguments. The basic idea behind the detector argument is that no physical system can detect whether time passes since both A- and B-theories "share the same physics" and so agree on which "physical events occur" (p. 34). Furthermore, assuming the supervenience of the mental on the physical, it follows that "The mind cannot be a passage detector" either (p. 36). However, to say that A- and B-theories "share the same physics" is only to say that a certain structural or mathematical mapping holds between the theories. As Maudlin (responding to earlier versions of this argument in Huw Price 1996 and Williams 1951) insists, for the A-theorist, the B-theory describes "a world with no objective flow of time at all" and so "a world in which there is no time at all" (2002, p. 251). From this perspective, there is a dramatic difference in the physical realities described by the two theories. Indeed, from this perspective, B-theoretic reality arguably does not contain any genuine events at all, events being occurrences in time.

Prosser is unmoved by this reply, insisting that

we should recall our dialectical starting point: the A-theorist claims that the A-theory is true because experience tells us that it is true. But what we have now seen is that experience would be just as it is on the assumption that the A-theory is true, and also on the assumption that the B-theory is true. Consequently the nature of experience fails to favour the A-theory (p. 40).

Switch in "sceptic" for "B-theorist" and we have, as Prosser recognizes (p. 41), here a dialectical situation comparable to that familiar from discussions of external world scepticism. Like Prosser's detector argument, such scepticism trades on the contention that we cannot know certain facts (e.g. about the external world) since our evidence would be just the same were we in a sceptical scenario (e.g. a brain-in-a-vat). Minded of the comparison, various responses to Prosser's detector argument suggest themselves. One such response grants that our experience is consistent with the B-theory but denies that it follows that our experience cannot provide us with knowledge of the A-theory (perhaps the B-theory is not a relevant alternative). A different response flatly denies that our experience is consistent with the B-theory (cf. Maudlin's objection just discussed). Certainly, the B-theorist will dispute this claim. But this only means that the A-theorist cannot appeal to experience to convince B-theorists or agnostics. It does not show that it cannot warrant her own belief in the theory.

A great deal more could be said here. But Prosser presses on because he thinks he has a more powerful argument against the A-theory. According to this multi-detector argument, even if the A-theory were true, we could not detect the passage of time. The nub of this argument is the idea that, for us to experience the passing of time, some specific aspect of our experience would have to be differentially sensitive to time's passage. And Prosser cannot see how this could be. However, talk of temporal passage is, in effect, a way of talking about change as conceived by the A-theorist. From this perspective, one might think that one saw time passing whenever one saw change occur, or indeed simply enjoyed experience (itself a kind of change). Prosser does not want to deny that we perceive change, or have experiences.[3] Prosser acknowledges something like this suggestion but insists that change can be understood B-theoretically. As a result, he thinks that it would "beg the question" to hold that time passes on the basis of perceiving change (p. 50). However, this simply returns us to the dialectical concerns which Prosser's original detector argument faces. For, acknowledging that the appeal will not convince the B-theorist, it remains unclear why the A-theorist cannot think of our experience of change as warranting their view that time passes.

Turning to Prosser's diagnostic project, Prosser's most striking suggestion is that change is experienced as dynamic because experience misrepresents its objects as enduring as opposed to perduring. Taking his lead from Kant, Prosser hypothesizes that "in order to experience change our experience must . . . represent something as retaining its identity through the change," and this, he continues, "requires objects to be represented as enduring" (p. 173). To the obvious objection that perdurantists don't deny that objects retain their identities through time, Prosser replies that the perdurantist account "does not correctly capture the phenomenology or the way we naturally think, prior to philosophical reflection" (p. 173). This claim deserves further development. Prosser criticizes Brian J. Scholl's (2007) contention that our visual systems compute "object file" representations of objects as enduring on the (very reasonable) ground that all we can really say is that our visual systems represent objects as persisting (p. 181). But, what's sauce for the goose is sauce for the gander. Why not think that a neutral notion of persistence suffices to capture our perceptual phenomenology? If it does, Prosser's key diagnosis of why change is experienced as dynamic falls short.

Despite such inevitable concerns, Prosser's proposals are important and his discussion engaging. His treatment also contains much of value even to those who do not share his guiding interest in defending the B-theory. For instance, if Prosser is right that experience represents objects as enduring, but wrong to think that we have no choice but accept the B-theory, the A-theorist might hope to turn his claims to her advantage. Moreover, many of Prosser's discussions -- especially those in chapters four and five -- are of interest quite apart from the A versus B debate. In short, whatever one's perspective, Prosser's book is rich fare for thought, and essential reading for anyone puzzled by our experiential encounter with time.


Crisp, T. M. 2003. 'Presentism' in M. J. Loux and D. W. Zimmerman (eds.) The Oxford Handbook of Metaphysics. Oxford University Press, pp. 211-45.

Deng, N. 2013a. 'Our experiencing of passage on the B-theory' Erkenntnis 78(4): 713-726.

Deng, N. 2013b. 'On explaining why time seems to pass' Southern Journal of Philosophy 51(3): 367-382.

Hoerl, C. 2014. 'Do we (seem) to perceive passage?' Philosophical Explorations 17: 188-202.

Markosian, N. 2004. 'A defence of presentism' Oxford Studies in Metaphysics 1(3): 47-82.

Maudlin, T. 2002. 'Remarks on the passing of time' Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 102(3): 237-252.

McTaggart, J. M. E. 1908. 'The unreality of time' Mind 18: 457-84.

McTaggart, J. M. E. 1927. The Nature of Existence, vol. II. Cambridge University Press.

Phillips, I. 2010. 'Perceiving temporal properties' European Journal of Philosophy 18(2): 176-202.

Price, H. 1996. Time's Arrow and Archimedes' Point: New Directions for the Physics of Time. Oxford University Press.

Scholl, B. J. 2007. 'Object persistence in philosophy and psychology' Mind & Language 22: 563-91.

Sullivan, M. 2012. 'The minimal A-theory' Philosophical Studies 158(2): 149-174.Williams, D. C. 1951. 'The myth of passage' Journal of Philosophy 48: 457-72.

Zimmerman, D. W. 2008. 'The privileged present: defending an "A-theory" of time' in T. Sider, J. Hawthorne and D. W. Zimmerman (eds.) Contemporary Debates in Metaphysics. Blackwell, 211-225.

[1] Though critical of various aspects of my own work, I found myself in sympathy with many of Prosser's claims here, not least his scepticism concerning how genuine the differences are between extensionalism and various forms of retentionalism (p. 147; cf. Phillips 2010).

[2] For relevant discussion see Sullivan (2012) on "Moorean" arguments for temporary existence.

[3] I take it that even if all experience necessarily involves awareness of change, our differential sensitivity to determinate kinds of change, e.g. slow or fast motion, means there is no obvious puzzle concerning our capacity to experience change.