Experiencing William James: Belief in a Pluralistic World

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James Campbell. Experiencing William James: Belief in a Pluralistic World, University of Virginia Press, 2017, 382 pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780813940472.

Reviewed by Jeremy Dunham, Durham University


If you hang around with the Peirce crowd long enough, you'll probably hear this otherwise lovely group of people make what I consider to be a mean joke: "Of course, of the two brothers, Henry James was the real philosopher, and William the writer".[1] I suspect that James Campbell wouldn't consider this to be a mean joke at all. Campbell's James is not a traditional philosopher, but in some sense an artist who is able to use his (undoubtedly remarkable) literary skills to express his vision of the world. This book is an attempt to present William James's vision. Although it covers the many dimensions of James's thought in separate chapters -- dedicated to 'Psychology and Philosophy', 'Pragmatism', 'Ethics and Social Thought', etc. -- it tries, at the same time, to present all of them as part of a single whole and to show how each part influences the others.

The scope of the book is one of its main strengths. While many works tend to focus just on James's epistemological writings, Campbell's book also includes detailed and wide-ranging discussions of his works on ethics, social issues, and religion. Campbell is also very attentive to the way that James's religious and ethical thought influences his epistemological writings. However, the way that James's work is presented as part of one single vision reveals a crucial interpretative decision. For Campbell, James's work can be treated ahistorically. James's ideas do not change significantly over time. Although James's newer works may present new ideas, these ideas do not result from changes in, or contradict, his earlier ones. This is especially apparent in the chapter on 'Radical Empiricism', where the first section uses a discussion from James's posthumous Some Problems of Philosophy (WWJ VII 1911) to introduce the views presented in a series of essays on Radical Empiricism written from 1904 to 1905 (at least five years before the writing of Some Problems). This is surprising because James himself claims to have undergone a significant a philosophical conversion at some point around 1907 (see WWJ IV 1909, 97; CWJ XI 1907, 377; and CWJ XII 1908, 278-279) -- a conversion he attributes to reading Bergson's Creative Evolution. Campbell quickly brushes off this claim by means of a citation from Schiller, who thought that James always overstated his intellectual debts. However, whether or not Bergson's influence was decisive, it is clear that James did seriously develop his philosophy during this period. We have a detailed record of James's struggles in what is known as the 'Miller-Bode' notebook (WWJ XVIII 1905-1908, 63-130). In this notebook, James scribbles out many different attempts to solve a major difficulty that the 1904-1905 radical empiricism faced: 'How can two minds know the same thing?' In this notebook, we have evidence of how serious a philosopher -- a traditional philosopher -- James was. He continually attempts to develop philosophical solutions to make his system work, and when he realises that he cannot, he alters the foundations of his metaphysics considerably. A book review is not the place to go into these struggles in any detail, but I do think that they show that James's philosophy was continually developing and why the interpreter needs to be very careful when using later works to clarify earlier ones.

One particularly interesting aspect of Campbell's ahistorical reading of James is his interpretation of his 'Will to Believe' doctrine and its relationship to the pragmatist theory of truth. There is a fairly lively scholarly debate over how to interpret the 'Will to Believe'. The key question is whether or not James is claiming that different epistemic standards operate in religious and scientific beliefs. Recently, Cheryl Misak (2013), Alexander Klein (2015), and I (2015) have argued that James does not claim this, while David Hollinger (1997) has argued that he does. Campbell agrees with Hollinger, but what distinguishes Campbell's position from Hollinger's is that while Hollinger believes that James changes his mind and then develops a unitary epistemology by the time of the Pragmatism lectures, Campbell argues that James's consistently maintains this dualistic, or 'separate spheres' epistemology, even in his later works.

This dualism of epistemic standards, Campbell claims, is evidenced in James's distinction between 'recording' and 'contribution' cases -- a football commentator merely records the facts, while the footballer contributes to them. The football commentator's belief that Arsenal will win has no effect on whether they will win, but the player needs to believe that they will win in order for that to come about. Science deals with 'recording' cases, but James claims that there is another epistemic domain, 'religion,' which is concerned with contribution cases. The analogy is slightly shaky -- belief in God will not bring about God's existence -- but, nevertheless, it might bring about a healthier mental psychology or better moral behaviour. The belief in God contributes to bringing about a positive change in the world.

There are certainly reasons why Campbell's distinction might seem appealing. As Campbell says, if James is understood as maintaining a unitary epistemology, then it is possible to interpret him as holding the wild view that we can believe whatever we want as long as it makes us happier in any case. So if believing that all 'cats are girls and all dogs are boys' makes me happier, then I am justified in believing it. Misak objects to James for precisely this reason. She claims that what James does in the 'Will to Believe' is to stretch the idea of the evidence that we accept for our beliefs to such an extent that it includes feelings of psychological satisfaction. If belief in God makes us happier, since that counts as positive evidence in favour of the belief, we ought to believe it. However, even though Campbell is trying to defend James's from the kind of objection Misak presents, they both agree on one critical point: unlike Peirce, for example, they see James as rallying against the encroachment on matters of vital importance to us by the scientific method. For Campbell, James resists this by the epistemological separation between recording and contribution cases. For Misak, he resists it by extending the notion of evidence far beyond what a laboratory scientist would allow.

I think this is the heart of the problem. As long as we take James's argument to be fundamentally directed against the scientific method, serious difficulties will arise for him. However, I don't think that we need to interpret his work in this way. As I understand the paper,[2] what James is trying to do is to show not that we need to extend or make space outside of our scientific epistemic practices, but rather that religious faith can be consistent with our current scientific epistemic practices. The 'Will to Believe' is supposed to be a justification of 'faith', but as James writes in a letter to Henry William Rankin, 'Adopt your hypothesis, and see how it agrees with life -- That is faith' (WWJ VI 1897, 252). The point of a large portion of the Will to Believe (as well as earlier writings such as the 1879-1882 'Sentiment of Rationality') is to show that faith is not inconsistent with science. In fact, scientific empiricism requires it. The rationalists could lay claim to absolute certainty due to the natural light of reason, but for scientific empiricists there is no bell that magically tolls to inform us that we have sufficient evidence, and thus, there is always an element of faith in our belief.[3] Understood this way, we can interpret the 'Will to Believe' as presenting a unitary epistemology, but without the consequence that we can believe whatever we want as long as it makes us feel happier. It argues, rather, that we can in religion -- just as we do in science -- act on hypotheses that have not been proven, especially if we are forced on the issue to make a decision one way or the other. Such beliefs, however, are fallible. James's religious views are, therefore, far from traditional. We must always remain sensitive to the fact that our religious beliefs could be proven to be false.

Campbell's distinction between 'recording' and 'contribution' cases is made to do more work in his interpretation of James. He argues that this also is crucial for understanding James's pragmatist theory of truth, and that it can again be used to defuse some of the crudest objections to James's thought. For Campbell's James, most truths are simply recording cases. 'There is a cathedral in Durham' is true if and only if there really is a cathedral in Durham. James then does not fully object to the Copy Theory of Truth. He thinks that this theory can account for most cases, but that there are some cases for which it cannot account: contribution cases. When James says 'truth happens to an idea. It becomes true, is made true by events' (WWJ I 1907, 97), he is stressing the dynamic nature of reality, i.e., the fact that while in 2016 it was not true that I was married, in 2018 it is true. However, in order for that to be true, I (and others) had to bring it about.

Understood in this way, James's theory of truth starts to sound closer to an everyday understanding of truth. However, I worry that it does so at the risk of removing all that is novel about it from it. At the heart of James's theory is the reversal of the copy theory's direction of fit. For James, my idea[4] of Memorial Hall in Harvard is true not because it is the end result of a causal chain that leads all the way back to a sighting of it, but rather because it can, if I need to get there, lead me to it and to recognise it when I'm there. It is future-directed, not backwards-directed. This has the perhaps startling conclusion that before my idea of Memorial Hall had led me to Memorial Hall, I could not say that my idea of Memorial Hall was true. However, on the 11th of January 2016 -- the first time I made my way to Memorial Hall -- the idea became true as it successfully led me to the building.[5] Truth is a success term. So when James says: 'Truth is made, just as health, wealth and strength are made, in the course of experience' (WWJ I 1907, 104), this does not refer, as Campbell suggests, to the relatively trite fact that when we do stuff we contribute to new true facts coming about, but rather that our idea becomes true in the process of verification. What this means is not that my idea of Memorial Hall becomes true only once Memorial Hall is built -- although Memorial Hall's existence in Harvard then becomes a fact -- but rather that it becomes true only if it successfully leads me to it and allows me to navigate around it. Once we understand this, we can understand why James frequently equates truth with usefulness. If my idea of Memorial Hall leads me there, it is useful. If it cannot lead me there it is useless -- and therefore false.

You might think that this theory of truth sounds absolutely bonkers. I certainly don't have the space to defend it here, nor even to explain all of its features,[6] but it should at least sound novel and interesting, and I worry that the novelty of the theory is lost within this interpretative framework of 'recording' and 'contribution' cases.

To conclude, despite my reservations about certain methodological and interpretive points, there can be no doubt that this book brings to James scholarship a whole host of new insights and interesting interpretations to discuss and debate. I have barely scratched the surface of the themes taken up in it. Campbell's book is one of the most wide-ranging introductions to James's thought, and the sections on religion and his social thought (which I have not had the chance to discuss at all) will be of especial interest to students and scholars alike. I expect that this book will be discussed by James scholars and used for teaching for many years to come.


I’d like to thank Alexander Klein for reading a draft of this review and for some very helpful feedback.


WJC: James, W. (1992-2004) The Correspondence of William James. 12 Vols. I. K. Skrupskelis et al. (eds.). University of Virginia Press

WWJ: James, W. The Works of William James. 19 Vols. Edited by Fredson Bowers and Ignas K. Skrupskelis. (eds.). Harvard University Press


Donaldson, T. 'What was James's Theory of Truth?'. In: Klein, A. (ed.). (forthcoming) The Oxford Handbook to William James. Oxford University Press

Dunham, J (2015) 'Idealism, Pragmatism, and the Will to Believe'. British Journal for the History of Philosophy. 23(4): 756-778

Hollinger, D. (1997) 'James, Clifford, and the Scientific Conscience'. In: Putnam, R.A. (ed.) The Cambridge Companion to William James. Cambridge University Press

Jackman, H. (1998) 'James' Pragmatic Account of Intentionality and Truth'. Transactions of the C.S. Peirce Society. 34(1): 155-181

Klein, A. (2015) 'Science, Religion, and "The Will to Believe."' HOPOS: The Journal of the International Society of the History of the Philosophy of Science Society 5(1): 72-117

Misak, C. (2013) The American Pragmatists. Oxford University Press

Pippin, R. (2000) Henry James and Modern Moral Life. Cambridge University Press

[1] On Henry James’s philosophy, see Pippin (2000)

[2] Following Klein (2015).

[3] I defend this reading in Dunham (2015). The article is a contextualist defence that relies heavily on the fact that the Will to Believe doctrine was developed in dialogue with French neo-criticist philosopher Charles Renouvier (see WJC IIX 1897, 324).

[4] As Jackman correctly notes, for James, truth is ‘not just a property of assertions and judgments, but also of mental images and even names’ (1998: 158).

[5] A photo of this very moment. 

[6] For excellent discussions of James’s theory of truth see Jackman (1998) and Donaldson (forthcoming).