Experimental Metaphysics

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David Rose (ed.), Experimental Metaphysics, Bloomsbury, 2017, 242pp., $91.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781474278614.

Reviewed by David Mark Kovacs, Tel Aviv University


This book is the latest in a series from Bloomsbury on experimental philosophy and its applications to specific areas. Experimental philosophy started in the early 2000s as a radical movement seeking to replace “armchair” reliance on intuitions with a systematic collection of data about them, basically with the tools and methods of cognitive science. (“Seeking to replace” may be an overly diplomatic expression; some probably still remember the image of the burning armchair.) As the movement gained traction this radical rhetoric gradually tapered off, and the results of experimental work are now increasingly incorporated into many mainstream areas of philosophy, for instance, epistemology and the philosophy of action. Yet, while empirical methods per se are not alien to metaphysics (much work in the area is informed by physics, biology, and other natural sciences), as of yet it has been relatively unaffected by the experimental philosophy movement. Readers might therefore expect this volume to contain cutting-edge experimental work in hitherto unexplored areas of metaphysics.

The book fulfills this expectation only partially. While the essays are worth reading in their own right, they make the title slightly misleading, as at most half of them can be described as actually doing experimental metaphysics in the above sense. The eight essays in the volume can roughly be divided into three categories: the first three (by Uriah Kriegel, Jason Turner, and Sara Bernstein) explore the general methodological question of how, if at all, experimental work on folk intuitions can bear on metaphysical problems, or in Bernstein’s case, on causation in particular. The essays by Joshua Shepherd and by David Rose and Jonathan Schaffer are the ones that most squarely fall under the label ‘experimental metaphysics’: they apply the methods of experimental philosophy to first-order metaphysical questions (a shorter version of Rose and Schaffer’s paper was previously published in Nous). Essays by Shaun Nichols and by Daniel Korman and Chad Carmichael seriously engage with experimental work and respond to various experiment-based arguments (Korman and Carmichael’s paper is a direct response to Schaffer and Rose’s). Finally, Jacob Dink and Lance Rips’s paper on folk teleology doesn’t neatly fit into any of these three categories; it’s an interesting and largely empirical paper that defends certain forms of teleological thinking, but without many direct lessons for any particular metaphysical debate. In what follows, I will mostly focus on some general methodological ideas prevalent throughout the volume, and their interaction with the first-order experimental work in it. I lack the space to discuss in detail all of the essays, but this should by no means be interpreted as a negative judgment on their value.

It’s worth starting with a few observations on the two big-picture methodological essays by Kriegel and by Turner. Interestingly, despite their many differences, these two papers end up defending fairly similar conceptions of experimental philosophy’s role in metaphysics, and can both be described as attempts to improve on the philosophical program that has come to be known as the “Canberra Plan”. The basic idea behind the Canberra plan is that philosophical questions about some F can be approached in two stages. First, we should get clear on our standing concept of F. We do this by collecting the various folk platitudes we have about F, and writing them up into F’s Ramsey sentence: an existentially quantified sentence that replaces every occurrence of F with variables and lists all the folk platitudes about F. This first stage is essentially a kind of conceptual analysis, but without the optimistic view frequently associated with such projects that most concepts lend themselves to simple and short analyses. Second, we find the best realizer of F’s Ramsey sentence — the thing that most deserves to be called ‘F’. In many (perhaps most) cases we will not find anything that satisfies all our platitudes; what’s important is that we can often find something that satisfies most of them, and enough of them to yield a philosophically satisfactory theory of F. The potential role of experimental philosophy is pretty clear on this picture: experimental work could inform the outcome of the first stage, since controlled experiments about ordinary people’s beliefs or intuitions about F could affect the folk platitudes we write into F’s Ramsey-sentence. In other words, experimental methods can be helpful in the conceptual analysis stage of metaphysical inquiry.

Now, there are problems with the simple picture sketched above, of which Kriegel and Turner are well aware. As a result, they depart from the orthodox conception of the Canberra plan in significant ways, which I can only briefly gesture at here. In response to various challenges, Kriegel weakens the requirements imposed on Ramsey sentences: for example, he recommends that we incorporate “deferential platitudes” to accommodate intuitions about direct and indexical reference; and in order to allow for different platitudes carrying different weights, he follows Lewis and opts for more sentences that disjoin conjunctions of platitudes. Turner’s departure from the original Canberra plan is more radical. He distinguishes concepts (the mental vehicles of our thoughts about a thing) and conceptions (a cluster of reasonably general and in some sense “essential” beliefs about that thing), and points out that the content of a concept doesn’t necessarily line up with our conception of it. He then offers a global interpretationist account of assigning content to our concepts (much in the spirit of that defended in Lewis 1974). The picture invokes the notion of an ideal interpreter who knows all the non-semantic facts, involving dispositional facts about how people would behave in various counterfactual situations. The ideal interpreter would assign mental content on the basis of various general principles (e.g. “people’s beliefs are by and large rational and responsive to their evidence”) and would holistically determine which total distribution of content assignments overall satisfies them best. There are many interesting details in Turner’s discussion that I’m skipping over here; perhaps the most important way in which his view differs from the orthodox Canberra plan is that it attributes a significant role to behavioral patterns that aren’t conveniently described as “platitudes” or “conceptions”.

The differences notwithstanding, Kriegel and Turner offer very similar justifications for using experimental methods in metaphysics. Whenever we ask metaphysical questions about some Fs, an important step in answering those questions is to figure out what we mean by ‘F’: to unearth the various platitudes about Fs (according to Kriegel) or to clarify what our conception of Fs involves (according to Turner). It is reasonably clear at this point that on both views experiments will have a legitimate, albeit limited, role. Kriegel and Turner are quite explicit about this and accordingly advertise their accounts as modest defenses of experimental philosophy. For them, the work of the experimental metaphysician walking around with questionnaires doesn’t essentially differ from the work of the armchair metaphysician simply consulting her intuitions. It’s just that the experimental metaphysician is likely going to be a more efficient collector of the same kind of evidence, either because it would take too much time for a single person to work out a concept’s complete Ramsey sentence (for Kriegel) or because armchair philosophers can access only the very small data set that is their own conception of particular concepts (for Turner).

Many other contributors to the volume seem to adopt a similar justification for experimental metaphysics. Bernstein, for example, offers a taxonomy of issues one could pursue under the general label “the metaphysics of causation”, and discusses a number of obstacles to using experimental data in resolving them. Among other things, she argues that the potential uses of such data are limited to the extent that our concept of causation might itself be somewhat confused, and also notes that experimental work is unlikely to be fruitful for “fundamental metaphysics” (i.e., that part of metaphysics that investigates the fundamental structure of the world, irrespective of our conception of it). In one of the more experimentally focused papers, Shepherd argues (based on a study he undertook) that the folk notion of free will is an incompatibilist notion, and explores the normative significance of this result. In doing so, he suggests that the main role of empirical work is to help us “explicate”, in Carnap’s sense, philosophically interesting folk concepts, i.e. to replace them with simpler, more precise and more useful concepts. He also mentions Kriegel’s view as a viable alternative to his own, and as another possible justification of the approach he takes in the paper.

Other papers, while using experimental tools, are less explicit about their methodological underpinnings. We can get a glimpse into what might be an alternative to the (broadly understood) “Canberra plan” model by taking a look at Schaffer and Rose’s paper, “Folk Mereology is Teleological”, and Korman and Carmichael’s response to it. The former paper’s main argumentative strategy has two parts. The first is to show (through various surveys, which are described in the paper) that the folk’s intuitions about composition (about when various material objects make up some further object) are teleological through and through. (For example, people are likelier to judge that two mice glued together compose something if they think that gluing them together serves some purpose.) The second step is to show that although certain forms of teleological reasoning are legitimate, the kind of teleology that fuels folk intuitions about composition are instances—which they call “teleo-heavy”—of the problematic kind of teleomentalism that attributes intentions and goals to inanimate things. Their conclusion is that folk intuitions about composition are fit for debunking: they shouldn’t be seen as probative at all in material-object metaphysics.

Korman and Carmichael question each step of this reasoning: whether the experiments in question really show anything about the folk’s intuitions about composition, whether their beliefs have really been shown to be affected by teleological thinking, and whether it would be problematic even if they were. One of their critical observations, though, also highlights another way in which experimental work could have bearing on metaphysical questions. They argue that Schaffer and Rose’s findings, even if correct, don’t necessarily jeopardize common sense accounts of composition. After all, a philosopher drawn to such an account can justify it simply on the basis of her own intuition, rather than the opinions of the folk. Experimental work can serve as a defeater if it shows that our (that is, philosophers’) intuitions were also shaped by irrelevant influences, but we don’t need to conduct experiments to accept philosophical claims on the basis of our own intuitions.

This is an interesting proposal, not least because experimental philosophy has in the past been attacked (most famously by Herman Cappelen) on the basis that philosophers don’t essentially rely on intuitions when justifying their views. Korman and Carmichael think they do (or that at least they could), but on their take, this seems to reduce rather than increase the relevance of experimental work: since each of us can rely on our own intuitions without consulting others, we don’t need experimental work, at least not at the initial stage of evidence gathering. Various responses are open to Schaffer and Rose. The most straightforward one would be to argue, with some plausibility, that philosophers are unlikely to be entirely free of the cognitive biases that affect folk intuitions. Alternatively, they could stick with the “Canberra Plan”-style approach and insist that the experiments show that nothing is a perfect realizer of the folk concept of composition, which therefore has to be replaced by a corrected philosophical notion that plays largely the same roles. (This is not the way they choose to proceed in the paper.)

As the above discussion suggests, while all contributors accept that experimental work has a legitimate role to play in metaphysics, most of them appear to endorse a background view that renders this role relatively modest. This is not necessarily a criticism, but it would have been interesting to see arguments to the effect that metaphysicians are missing something crucial when they don’t use experimental methods. My more important critical observation about the volume is that it is somewhat conservative in the range of topics it covers: it largely focuses on those few issues in metaphysics where experimental methods have already been in use for quite a few years. Free will (the main subject of Shepherd’s piece) is the most obvious case in point, but there has also been at least some awareness of the relevance of cognitive science to intuitions about causation and essence (the topics of Bernstein’s and Nichols’ papers). The most underexplored topic to make it into the volume is the metaphysics of composition, discussed in Schaffer and Rose’s and Korman and Carmichael’s paper. This is not to say that any of the papers that appear in the volume should have been left out, but rather, that an opportunity has been missed to include some hitherto uncovered topics. In a large number of live debates in metaphysics, substantive psychological assumptions play a significant (if sometimes unacknowledged) role. These debates could arguably benefit from experimental work, and in some of them, hints for where such work could be relevant already exist: for example, temporal experience and the philosophy of time (Paul 2016), quantifier variance and quantifier restriction in ontological disputes  (Korman 2009, Keller 2015), the cognitive function of number concepts and the existence of numbers (Hofweber 2016: Ch. 5), and even explanatory intuitions about grounding  (Miller and Norton 2017).

Perhaps the absence of these topics is simply a sign that while experimental philosophy has matured into a respectable field widely recognized for the useful tools it has to offer, experimental metaphysics is still very much in its infancy. Most of the important work that brings cognitive science and experimental methods to bear on metaphysics is yet to be undertaken, but this volume is a good start.


Hofweber, Thomas (2016), Ontology and the Ambitions of Metaphysics, Oxford University Press

Keller, John (2015), “Semantics, Paraphrase, and Ontology”, Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, 9: 89-128

Korman, Daniel Z. (2009), “Unrestrcited Composition and Restricted Quantification”, Philosophical Studies, 140: 319-334

Lewis, David K. (1974), “Radical Interpretation,” Synthese, 23: 331-344

Miller, Kristie and James Norton (2017), “Grounding: it’s (probably) all in the head”, Philosophical Studies, 174: 3059-3081

Paul, L.A. (2016), “Experience, Metaphysics, and Cognitive Science”, in Companion to Experimental Philosophy, edited by Justin Sytsma and Wesley Buckwalter, Blackwell