Experimental Philosophy: An Introduction

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Joshua Alexander, Experimental Philosophy: An Introduction, Polity Press, 2012, 200pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745649184.

Reviewed by Torfinn Thomesen Huvenes, University of St Andrews


Experimental philosophy is a controversial movement in contemporary philosophy that is based on the use of methods that are more commonly associated with psychology and the social sciences. The experimental philosophy movement is often seen as presenting a challenge for more traditional approaches to philosophy. Experimental philosophers have carried out different kinds of projects They have for instance conducted surveys to test the intuitions of non-philosophers about philosophically interesting cases, finding differences between the intuitions of philosophers and non-philosophers, as well as cultural, social, and gender differences. This work has generated numerous responses from those who want to defend a more traditional approach.

Joshua Alexander has written an introduction to this field. He introduces some of the most widely discussed work and discusses its philosophical implications, both with respect to specific philosophical issues and with respect to philosophical methodology more generally. The book also covers many of the criticisms that have been raised against experimental philosophy. However, it will not come as a surprise to those who are familiar with Alexander's previous work that he is sympathetic to the movement, and Alexander makes no point of hiding his sympathies. A significant part of the book is devoted to defending the relevance of experimental philosophy and providing answers to the criticisms that it has faced. In what follows, I will provide a relatively brief outline of the contents of the book, before I highlight some issues that a reader might want to pay attention to.

The book has five chapters, in addition to an introduction and a short epilogue. It seems fair to say that it is written against the background of a conception of philosophy according to which intuitions play an important role. Alexander opens the introduction by stating that 'We ask philosophical intuitions -- what we would say or how things seem to us to be -- to do a lot of work for us.' (p. 1, original emphasis). He goes on to offer a characterisation of experimental philosophy as an approach to the study of philosophical intuitions based on the methods of the social and cognitive sciences. In the first chapter he  discusses various conceptions of philosophical intuitions and the role that intuitions play in philosophy. The discussion of the different conceptions of intuitions is fairly limited, but Alexander does not seem to be too worried about not providing an answer to the question of what intuitions are as long as it is granted that they play an important role in philosophy.

The second and third chapters cover recent work on philosophical intuitions by experimental philosophers. In the second chapter, the focus is on intuitions about free will and moral responsibility and on intuitions about knowledge attributions. In the third chapter, the focus is on philosophy of mind, with most of the emphasis on Joshua Knobe's (2003) work on intentional action and the discussion that his work has generated. In these chapters, Alexander succeeds in conveying how difficult it is to derive clear philosophical conclusions from the kind of empirical work being done by experimental philosophers and he frequently emphasises the need for further empirical research.

The fourth chapter deals with more general issues having to do with the implications of experimental philosophy for philosophical methodology. Alexander presents several examples,such as the work of Jonathan Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, and Stephen Stich (2001) on cross-cultural variation in intuitions about Gettier cases. The lesson is supposed to be that experimental philosophers have shown that philosophical intuitions are sensitive to factors that we do not want them to be sensitive to, such as culture, gender, the order in which the cases are presented, and so forth. According to Alexander, this makes it problematic to rely on intuitions as evidence in philosophy and the answer is to do more empirical research.

In the fifth chapter, Alexander addresses some of the responses to experimental philosophy that have been raised by those who defend a more traditional conception of philosophy. For instance, there is a worry that experimental philosophy focuses on the wrong kind of intuitions, either because it is the intuitions of the experts that are relevant to philosophical practice, or because the right kind of intuitions are not revealed by survey responses. Another worry is that intuitions do not play an important role in philosophy after all. The fifth chapter is followed by a short epilogue, in which Alexander addresses some methodological challenges to experimental philosophy and comments on the description of experimental philosophy as a revolutionary movement in philosophy. Throughout, Alexander draws on his own work and the work of other experimental philosophers in an effort to show how experimental philosophers can respond to these worries.

There is no doubt that Alexander has written a clear and helpful introduction to experimental philosophy. While it is inevitable that certain topics will have to be left out or given less space, Alexander has done a good job of covering some of the most prominent work of both experimental philosophers and their critics. For someone who is looking to get a sense of what is going on in the debate from the point of view of someone who is sympathetic to the experimental philosophy movement, this would be an excellent place to start. Alexander's discussion of these issues should also be of interest to those who are already familiar with the debate, though there is some overlap with his previous work (Alexander 2010).

Having said that, there are a couple of issues that I want to highlight. When Alexander initially characterises what experimental philosophers are doing, he describes them as applying 'the methods of the social and cognitive sciences to the study of philosophical cognition since these methods are better suited than introspective methods to the study of what people, especially other people, actually think' (p. 2, original emphasis). This is open to a fairly broad interpretation and there is a sense in which this is as it should be. Alexander correctly points out that experimental philosophy is a diverse movement. But it also means that someone can be opposed to certain aspects of the movement without thinking that experimental philosophy, broadly construed, is irrelevant. For better or worse, a lot of the discussion surrounding experimental philosophy has focused on the practice of doing surveys to test the intuitions of non-philosophers. But it is possible to be suspicious of this practice while thinking that the methods of the social and cognitive sciences can provide important insights into philosophical cognition. It is worth paying attention to this point when Alexander suggests that further empirical research is needed and presents this as a vindication of the relevance of experimental philosophy. For instance, when he comments on Timothy Williamson's (2011) defence of the idea that philosophical training can confer relevant expertise with respect to thought-experiments, Alexander says:

questions about comparative procedural expertise [ . . . ] are precisely the kinds of questions that experimental philosophy should be well suited to help us investigate. So, it is hard to transform the possibility that philosophers have greater procedural know-how into a reason to diminish the philosophical significance of experimental philosophy (p. 98).

While it is clear that empirical research can be relevant to questions about expertise, there is a question of what kind of empirical research we are talking about. It is not clear how it would be helpful to just do more surveys on the intuitions of non-philosophers. It also seems that someone could hold a position like Williamson's without being opposed to the idea that further empirical research could be relevant. Williamson's claim is that the burden is on the experimental philosophers to show that the empirical evidence tips the balance in their favour.

A related point is that one can take issue with the conclusion that it is problematic to rely on intuitions as evidence by challenging the specific studies that experimental philosophers have carried out. Several philosophers have pointed out potential problems with studies that have been carried out by experimental philosophers. Jennifer Nagel (forthcoming) has for instance challenged Weinberg, Nichols, and Stich (2001) when it comes to the alleged cross-cultural variation in intuitions about Gettier cases, as well as other similar studies on epistemologically relevant intuitions. Insofar as her response is to a large extent based on empirical results, it is presumably not in opposition to the idea that empirical results can be relevant. While it is natural that Alexander does not want to get bogged down in a discussion about individual surveys, it is worth recognising that there is more room for resistance along these lines than he sometimes allows. It is possible to concede that empirical results can be philosophically relevant, but deny that experimental philosophers have in fact produced empirical results that undermine the practice of relying on intuitions in philosophy. Some philosophers will no doubt be uncomfortable with the idea that empirical results are even in principle relevant, but that is a different matter.

I also want to raise some questions concerning the conception of philosophy as relying on intuitions. Alexander understandably wants to remain more or less neutral when it comes to the question of exactly what philosophical intuitions are as long as they are recognised as playing an important role in philosophy. However, there is a worry that experimental philosophers have overestimated the extent to which more traditional philosophers rely on intuitions as evidence. Williamson (2007) can be understood as raising a worry along these lines and Herman Cappelen (2012) has recently argued that if we pay close attention to what philosophers actually do, we can see that they are not relying on intuitions. Another worry is that the attempt to undermine the practice of using intuitions as evidence in philosophy will also undermine other practices outside philosophy. In that case, we run the risk of ending up with a more general scepticism and that is something experimental philosophers do not want.

Alexander is aware of these worries and tries to respond to them. In the case of the former worry, he argues that intuitions do play an important role in philosophy, whether or not philosophers use the term 'intuition', and that 'we cannot actually do the kind of philosophical work that we want to do without, in some cases, appealing to our philosophical intuitions' (p. 103, my emphasis). However, even if that is true, it still leaves open the possibility that intuitions play a less important role in philosophy than Alexander seems to think. Furthermore, even if it is granted that all philosophical arguments have to rely on intuitions at some point, there is still a question of correctly identifying the relevant intuitions. It might sometimes be that it is not the intuitions about the thought-experiments that are relevant insofar as they only serve to illustrate the arguments that go along with them.

With respect to the latter worry, Alexander argues that there is no threat of global scepticism. He points out that there are relevant differences between intuitions and other sources of evidence, such as perception (p. 87). But we do not have to end up with global scepticism in order to have a problem. As Nagel (forthcoming) points out, it might already be problematic if the attempt to undermine the use of intuitions in philosophy would also undermine the capacity for so-called 'mindreading'. Even if it were just our judgments about, say, hypothetical cases involving knowledge attributions that were undermined, one might be suspicious. After all, do we not rely on such judgments outside philosophy? Experimental philosophers need to make sure that they are not relying on a conception of intuitions that prevents them from focusing on the practice of relying on intuitions in philosophy without undermining other practices.

It seems that the experimental philosophers are forced to strike a balance between potentially competing pressures. On the one hand, there is pressure to adopt a broad conception of intuitions in order to respond to concerns about whether philosophers do in fact rely extensively on intuitions as evidence. On the other hand, there is pressure to adopt a narrow conception of intuitions in order to make sure that one does not undermine too many of our non-philosophical practices. But it is easy to see how this could lead to trouble. While Alexander recognises these issues, there is a worry that he underestimates the difficulties associated with this balancing act. I take these issues to be unresolved, but for some recent discussion see Weinberg (2007) and Jonathan Ichikawa's (2011) response.

While I have mentioned some issues that I think are worth paying attention to, this does not alter the fact that Alexander has written a clear and helpful introduction to experimental philosophy. There are still a lot of unanswered questions about experimental philosophy, but it would not be reasonable to expect a relatively short introduction to address all of them.


Alexander, J. (2010). Is Experimental Philosophy Philosophically Significant?. Philosophical Psychology, 23, 377-389.

Cappelen, H. (2012). Philosophy without Intuitions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Ichikawa, J. (2011). Experimental Pressure Against Traditional Methodology. Philosophical Psychology, 25, 743-765.

Knobe, J. (2003). Intentional Action and Side Effects in Ordinary Language. Analysis, 63, 190-194.

Nagel, J. (forthcoming). Intuitions and Experiments: A Defense of the Case Method in Epistemology. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Weinberg, J. (2007). How to Challenge Intuitions Empirically Without Risking Skepticism. Midwest Studies in Philosophy, 31, 318-343.

Weinberg, J. Nichols, and S. Stich, S. (2001). Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions. Philosophical Topics, 29, 429-460.

Williamson, T. (2007). The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.

Williamson, T. (2011). Philosophical Expertise and the Burden of Proof. Metaphilosophy, 42, 215-229.