Experimental Philosophy, Rationalism, and Naturalism: Rethinking Philosophical Method

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Eugen Fischer and John Collins (eds.), Experimental Philosophy, Rationalism, and Naturalism: Rethinking Philosophical Method, Routledge, 2015, 302pp., $54.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781138887282.

Reviewed by Joachim Horvath, University of Cologne


Just when it seemed like the metaphilosophical controversies about experimental philosophy were about to die down, this timely and valuable volume reminds us that many of the crucial questions are still unresolved. For example, is there a genuine challenge from experimental philosophy to intuitions about hypothetical cases? And if so, how exactly should we understand the challenge? In a more constructive vein: how can experimental philosophy -- the study of intuitions about some philosophical issue X -- ever support substantial first-order conclusions about X? Finally, on the more intramural side of the debate: is experimental philosophy a step forward in the project of "naturalizing" philosophy or should naturalists look out for other, more promising approaches?

The editors of this volume, Eugen Fischer and John Collins, take a clear stand with their claim that the perennial divide between rationalism and naturalism has been "radically reshaped . . . through the advent of experimental philosophy" (p. 3). In their rich and opinionated introduction, "Rationalism and naturalism in the age of experimental philosophy", Fischer and Collins argue that experimental philosophy marks the advent of a "new metaphilosophical naturalism" that is neutral with respect to the old rationalism/naturalism debate and that provides an empirical framework for addressing many long-standing issues in philosophical methodology, such as the reliability of philosophical intuitions. Whether rationalists agree with the professed neutrality of experimental philosophy remains to be seen, however, given that many of them also pursue metaphilosophy largely from the armchair. In any case, Fischer and Collins are right that experimental philosophy adds more complexity to the metaphilosophical debate because it brings into sharp relief that one can be a rationalist in first-order philosophy yet a naturalist in metaphilosophy.

Fischer and Collins also provide a useful synopsis of the volume that is organized around their narrative of the rise of metaphilosophical naturalism. The volume is divided into two parts, "The armchair and naturalism" and "Varieties of experimental philosophy". It contains twelve original articles by leading contributors to metaphilosophical debates (e.g., Hilary Kornblith, David Papineau, Jonathan M. Weinberg) and up-and-coming metaphilosophers (e.g., Mikkel Gerken, Jennifer Nado, Daniele Sgaravatti). Most of the contributions fit very well with the volume's overall conception, with only a few outliers, and there is more interaction between the individual contributions than in many collections of this kind. In the balance of this review, I will briefly discuss the twelve articles in their order of appearance.

In the first chapter, "The nature of a priori intuitions: analytic or synthetic?", Papineau tentatively endorses the cogency of the analytic-synthetic distinction and then tries to set up a dilemma for a priori knowledge, namely that it is either "analytic and empty, or synthetic and problematic" (p. 54). In his elaboration of the analytic horn, he first rejects the idea that analytic statements are empty because they are only about our concepts and not about the world (see also Boghossian, 1997). Instead, Papineau's preferred diagnosis of the emptiness of analytic statements like 'any vixen is a female fox' is that "they have no existential commitments", and so "tell us nothing about what actually exists" (p. 60). However, according to the dominant logical view about universally quantified statements of this kind, they all share the characteristic feature of having no implications concerning what actually exists (see, e.g., Williamson, 2007, Chapter 4). It is thus hard to see how this feature can mark off analytic from synthetic statements in terms of their emptiness. Put differently, if what makes a statement empty is its lack of existential commitment, then why isn't a clearly synthetic statement like 'any vixen is a vertebrate' empty as well? I am also less than convinced by Papineau's take on the synthetic horn of the dilemma, in particular by his suggestion that "information acquired from tradition" is a "possible source of synthetic a priori knowledge" (p. 67), which inter alia depends on the problematic view that testimony is a source of a priori knowledge (cf. Malmgren, 2006; Burge, 2013).

Tim Crane's "Understanding the question: philosophy and its history" discusses the relevance of the history of philosophy for philosophy as a "creative, systematic discipline" (p. 72). Crane's main claim is that "we can only make real sense of the questions philosophers ask by locating them in relation to a historically constituted collection of canonical texts" (p. 73). While he makes several interesting points, one might still be skeptical about Crane's main claim. For example, if philosophical questions cannot be made intelligible in our contemporary context, and potential answers cannot be made sufficiently explicit, then they simply might not be good philosophical questions to begin with. In such cases, looking at historical texts and how other philosophers have interpreted them might only be a way of evading a long-overdue reassessment of one's own philosophical questions. Moreover, on pain of regress, philosophy could not have started from questions that were shaped by historical texts. So what prevents us from focusing on those questions that directly arise from deep human concerns or from a natural sense of wonder, as was Plato and Aristotle's view? In any case, by entangling all philosophical questions with a history of canonical texts, Crane sometimes comes close to a view that many systematic philosophers would emphatically reject, namely, that philosophy is an essentially textual discipline. But more importantly, a number of other systematic disciplines, such as physics, biology, or psychology, do not see their questions as being entangled with historical texts, and one wonders why philosophy is -- or should be -- any different.

In his insightful and provocative "Naturalism without metaphysics", Collins defends the Hempel-Chomsky line that physicalism -- currently the most popular form of metaphysical naturalism -- is a doctrine that "cannot be adequately grounded in actual science" (p. 87). Since current physics is incomplete and even incoherent, a commitment to physicalism either requires metaphysical speculation that is unsupported by science or scientifically unfounded speculation about the development of future physics. One worry about Collins's discussion of the problem of consciousness in particular is that some anti-physicalist arguments depend solely on a highly abstract characterization of physical theories that is unlikely to be overturned by future physics. For example, Chalmers (2003, p. 104) simply relies on the very general premise that "physical accounts explain only structure and function", and it seems that physics would have to change rather dramatically to falsify this premise.

Gerken's "Philosophical insights and modal cognition" is a rich discussion of modal rationalism in the wake of Kripkean a posteriori necessities. For reasons of space, I will constrain myself to commenting on Gerken's discussion of Gettier-style thought experiments. Gerken considers "the structure of the variation of a Gettier-style argument that goes from a modal premise against a non-modal thesis" (p. 117), such as the thesis that knowledge (K) and justified true belief (JTB) are coextensional. From a methodological perspective, it is not clear why Gerken considers an argument of this kind, because few (if any) contemporary epistemologists would employ such a weak non-modal thesis in their account of knowledge. Moreover, arguing against a non-modal thesis with a hypothetical counterexample may seem misguided in principle, and so Gerken concludes that an additional premise that links the non-modal coextensionality thesis with a necessity claim is needed here (p. 118). But given that many coextensionality claims are only contingently true, what reason is there to think that if K and JTB are coextensional, then they are also necessarily coextensional? Gerken suggests an analogy with Kripke's essentialist bridge principles, such as 'if gold is the element with atomic number 79, then it is necessary that gold is the element with atomic number 79'. However, Kripke's bridge principles are based on a more general argument that claims like 'gold is the element with atomic number 79' are necessary when natural kind terms like 'gold' are involved (cf. Kripke, 1980). Since there is no general reason why coextensional predicates should be necessarily coextensional, the analogy with Kripke's essentialist principles fails, and it is not clear to me whether Gerken's bridge principle can be supported in some other way.

In "Thought experiments, concepts, and conceptions", Sgaravatti defends the non-exceptionalist claim that "it is our ordinary ability to apply concepts that guides our judgments about thought experiments" (p. 134). He convincingly argues that psychological theories of concepts, such as prototype theory or exemplar theory, should be understood as characterizing the ordinary conceptions that we use to apply our concepts in everyday life, and not as semantic theories of the constituents of propositional thought. According to Sgaravatti, these ordinary psychological conceptions might suffice to justify the conclusions of armchair philosophical thought experiments. It remains to be seen, however, whether psychological conceptions that work well for everyday cases also work for the more recherché modal issues in which philosophers are typically interested (cf. Machery, ms).

Kornblith's "Naturalistic defenses of intuitions" elaborates and accentuates his uncompromising critique of the use of intuitions and conceptual analysis in philosophy. In particular, he takes other naturalistic philosophers to task for their attempts to rescue intuitions empirically. Kornblith's accentuation also brings out a number of contentious assumptions. For example, he claims that "our concepts of philosophically interesting targets of study may also be filled with error and omissions", just like "our concepts of gold, tigers, and matter" (p. 152). But this is only true if concepts like KNOWLEDGE or FREE WILL belong to the same semantic category as natural kind concepts like WATER or GOLD, which seems implausible for various reasons (cf. Horvath, 2015). Interestingly, Kornblith now concedes that we can sometimes "gain information about the world outside our concepts by investigating our concepts themselves" (p. 152). Yet in the same breath, he cautions that "when the worldly object of study is available to us for investigation, it is a mistake to look to our concepts rather than the world" (p. 152). What exactly is the worldly object of study in case of the philosophical analysis of knowledge, for example? At a minimum, such an analysis would involve a set of nontrivial necessary and sufficient conditions for knowledge. But how does "looking to the world" tell us whether, say, truth or belief are necessary for knowledge, and not just contingent generalizations? As it stands, Kornblith also needs a naturalistic epistemology of modality to complement his naturalistic dismissal of intuitions and conceptual analysis. Otherwise he does not merely abandon the philosophical armchair, but the traditional subject matter of philosophy altogether, which is often explicitly modal in character.

Being highly thoughtful and provocative at the same time has long been the hallmark of Weinberg's contributions to philosophical methodology, and his "Humans as instruments: or, the inevitability of experimental philosophy" proves no exception. His key idea is that humans can be seen as instruments for the intuitive investigation of philosophical categories, such as knowledge, justice, or agency. Unsurprisingly, Weinberg thinks that experimental philosophy can play a crucial role in our attempt to "get maximum epistemic value out of the human philosophical instrument" by attending to its limitations and blindspots (p. 183). Since I cannot do justice to Weinberg's rich and thought-provoking discussion here, I will limit myself to a few points of concern. I was not convinced by his discussion of Herman Cappelen's argument that judgments about esoteric and ordinary cases do not differ in their reliability, given that it seems so easy to come up with esoteric cases that are very easy to judge (a point originally made by Brian Weatherson (2008) in a blog post). According to Weinberg, Cappelen falls into the familiar trap of producing isolated counterexamples when the real task is to unsettle a systematic correlation (pp. 184-185). However, given that Cappelen suggests a general recipe for producing infinitely many counterexamples of this kind, it is not clear to me that he falls into any such trap. On a more general note, some philosophers may perceive Weinberg's picture of human beings as scientific instruments as an overly alienating perspective on epistemic agents. Philosophy might have important non-scientific purposes as well, for example, as an intellectual arena in which deep disagreements can be addressed in a peaceful and rational way. This may not produce any widely accepted textbook knowledge, but it could still be of vital social and cultural importance. Through this lens, the picture of humans as scientific instruments might be seen to thwart the very purpose of philosophy. Whether one shares these concerns or not, it testifies to the stimulating character of Weinberg's contribution that it invites us to confront them head-on.

In another provocative chapter, "The illusion of expertise", Edouard Machery first attempts to take down the expertise defense against the challenge from experimental philosophy and then speculates about why philosophers might be subject to an illusion of expertise. The version of the expertise defense that he discusses relies on "the conceptual expertise hypothesis", which is the claim "that philosophers are particularly skilled at applying concepts of philosophical importance" (p. 189). Machery first offers a number of theoretical reasons against the expertise hypothesis, which do not strike me as conclusive. For example, he sees no reason why moral philosophers should have a better understanding of ethical concepts than judges or ethical counselors (p. 194). But judges primarily apply legal concepts, whose relation to ethical concepts is often complicated and indirect, and ethical counselors, e.g., in hospitals, rarely proceed by simply telling their clients what is right and wrong. Machery also claims that philosophy students are not explicitly taught how to conduct thought experiments (p. 194), but this is consistent with the plausible assumption that they learn this skill by imitating their teachers or other philosophical role models. Next, Machery reviews the few empirical studies that directly investigate the intuitive expertise of professional philosophers, which do not really come out in their favor. But I think that he is too quick to put aside the reasonable concern that rejecting the expertise hypothesis "on the basis of only five studies" is premature. He asks, somewhat rhetorically: "How many studies are needed to shatter confidence in the conceptual expertise hypothesis?" (p. 197). By the most rigorous standards of scientific psychology, we can answer, probably a few dozen studies and a clear pattern of convergence in meta-studies. In any case, considerably more than five (after all, there is such a thing as experimenter bias too). So while I agree that the available results are not at all encouraging for the expertise defense, I think we should still be more open-minded about the existence and the precise contours of philosophers' intuitive expertise at this point (see, e.g., Buckwalter, 2014; Horvath and Wiegmann, forthcoming). In any case, speculation about an alleged illusion of expertise strikes me as coming too early, tempting as it may be.

In her excellent "Intuition, philosophical theorizing, and the threat of skepticism", Nado breathes new life into the debate concerning skepticism about intuition as a source of evidence. She first rehearses a number of arguments that rebut unrestricted forms of skepticism about intuition and then discusses Weinberg's (2007) more carefully restricted challenge. According to Weinberg, our philosophical practice of appealing to intuitions about cases (PAI) is methodologically unacceptable because it suffers from unmitigated fallibility (aka 'hopelessness'), i.e., fallibility without sufficient means for detecting and correcting one's errors. Nado objects that our non-philosophical practices of appealing to intuitions about particular cases are not clearly better off in this respect, and so Weinberg's challenge still threatens problematically skeptical implications. For this reason, Nado proposes a different strategy for challenging PAI that does not trade on differences in reliability or hopelessness. She points out that we engage in PAI for a specific purpose: to generate data for philosophical theories that involve highly demanding universal generalizations, such as 'necessarily, all justified true belief is knowledge'. According to Nado, a source of evidence "can be reliable enough for everyday belief formation while leading to serious error when applied to the task of generating a theory" (p. 212). This worry applies to all fallible sources of evidence, however, as Nado acknowledges (p. 214), and so her strategy threatens to imply skepticism about theory construction more generally. To deal with this problem, she suggests that PAI is typically used to generate intuitive data about "crucial cases", i.e., cases that are meant to decide between substantially different philosophical theories, which may render them especially problematic (p. 215). For example, whether one accepts or rejects Gettier intuitions or Twin Earth intuitions has far-reaching consequences for one's respective theory of knowledge or meaning. I think that Nado is onto something important here, but a lot depends on whether the notion of a "crucial case" can be developed in such a way that it does not, for example, invite skepticism about crucial experiments in science.

In "Experimental philosophy and naturalism", Bence Nanay inter alia presents and discusses three experiments on lay intuitions about action. In each experiment, participants were asked to rate how strongly they agreed or disagreed with the claim that they were performing an action in the first-person scenarios described (on a scale from 1 to 7). The three vignettes in each experiment were intended to characterize an action, a mere bodily movement, and an intermediate case. As it turned out, the participants did indeed rate the action cases more strongly (mean: 6.49, 5.80, 5.61) than the mere bodily movement cases (mean: 4.46, 3.48, 2.99), with the intermediate cases falling in between (mean: 5.80, 5.13, 3.99). Nanay takes this to "show that our folk intuitions discern three categories: actions, semi-actions and mere bodily movements" (p. 232). However, this conclusion strikes me as premature. Since the participants were only asked how much they agreed or disagreed with there being an action in the scenario, all we learn is that they agreed less strongly with the claim that the intermediate cases involved actions than with the claim that the action cases involve actions. In two out of three experiments, the participants even agreed with the claim that the intermediate cases were actions. The further conclusion that lay people recognize a third category in between actions and mere bodily movements requires substantial assumptions about when a response pattern of this kind is the result of a genuine "in-between" category and when it is simply the result of, for example, prototypicality effects that are due to the already acknowledged "outer" categories. On a final note, interpreting Nanay's experiments is not made easier by the fact that he does not report a number of important items, such as sample sizes, recruiting procedures, and demographic information (cf. Rusch and Bausch, 2015).

Amir Horowitz' "Experimental philosophical semantics and the real reference of 'Gödel'" is an interesting and nuanced discussion of the relevance of experimental semantics to the theory of reference. Horowitz argues, first, that expert semantic intuitions are not superior to lay intuitions, and second, that theoretical considerations alone cannot decide between competing theories of reference. But since experimental semantics indicates that lay intuitions vary with cultural background, skepticism about reference may seem unavoidable. Against this skeptical conclusion, he proposes a form of practice-dependent relativism that makes intuitions about reference constitutive of reference determination, which would also vindicate a constructive role for experimental semantics. One criticism I have is that Horowitz dispenses too quickly with the expertise defense of semantic intuitions given that he discusses only two proposals to this effect: that expert intuitions might be externally calibrated, and that experts might have better semantic theories (p. 246). Another reasonable hypothesis, also discussed by Machery (see above), would be that experts have better skills in applying the relevant semantic concepts and distinctions.

In the closing chapter, "Intuitions and illusions: from explanation and experiment to assessment", Fischer, a philosopher, psycholinguist Paul E. Engelhardt, and computational linguist Aurélie Herbelot try to expose the argument from illusion as an instance of how ordinary language use can hold us captive (in the spirit of J.L. Austin). The argument from illusion tries to establish that, when things look different than they are, we are not aware of external objects but only of sense data of some sort -- a conclusion that is seemingly at odds with common sense. By relying on a pioneering use of methods from psycholinguistics and distributional semantics, the authors suggest a complex abductive explanation of the intuitions underlying this argument, with the aim of debunking them as cognitive illusions. In this way, their chapter can be seen as a revival of the idea of problem-resolution through ordinary language analysis with the rigorous methods of cognitive science (see also Fischer, 2014). Since I cannot do justice to their sophisticated use of experimental methods here, let me just highlight one critical issue with a broad brush. Roughly, the authors try to show that verbs like 'looks' or 'seems', which figure crucially in various instances of the argument from illusion, are accompanied by certain automatic stereotypical associations. Although these associations are generally reliable, they spell trouble in the artificial context of the argument from illusion, where the verbs in question are used in a technical sense that gives rise to cognitive illusions. For example, the associations facilitate the inferential leap from 'this coin looks elliptical' to 'there is something elliptical here, i.e., a sense datum'. However, current textbook reconstructions of the argument from illusion, as the authors report them (pp. 261-262), offer a potential justification for inferences of this kind: the so-called 'Phenomenal Principle', which roughly says that if something appears F to a subject, then she is aware of something that is F. The authors try to block this justificatory route by arguing that proponents of the argument from illusion "often do not state the Phenomenal Principle" or "fail to provide any supporting argument" for it (p. 263). But proponents of the argument could simply regard the principle as directly intuitive and thus reject the need for supporting arguments in its favor and also deny that its justification depends on intuitions about particular cases. If at all plausible -- and if the findings of Fischer, Engelhardt, and Herbelot cannot be equally applied to the general principle -- then such a response might be a way to circumvent their challenging criticism.


For comments on a first draft of this review I am very grateful to John Collins, Eugen Fischer, Thomas Grundmann, Jens Kipper, and Nicole Standen-Mills.


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