Experimental Philosophy, Volume 2

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Joshua Knobe and Shaun Nichols (eds.), Experimental Philosophy, Volume 2, Oxford University Press, 2014, 374pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199927401.

Reviewed by Peggy DesAutels, University of Dayton


Experimental philosophy is a relatively new and rapidly evolving sub-discipline within philosophy. Both the topics covered and methodologies used are somewhat in flux. Nonetheless, Joshua Knobe and Shaun Nichols have been at the forefront at helping to define and exemplify some of the possibilities tied to this new approach to philosophy. In this book they include papers published in the five years since the publication of their first volume1 (reviewed by Frank Jackson in Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews, 2008.12.06).

To date, experimental philosophy has been closely allied with a subset of empirical philosophy. The goal of empirical philosophy, broadly construed, is to incorporate scientific empirical findings into philosophic research. Philosophers of science have been doing this for quite some time. In the past few decades, a broader spectrum of philosophers has drawn on research in the sciences, including such sciences as psychology, neuroscience, and the social sciences. Most experimental philosophy to date has concerned itself with experiments tied to eliciting and analyzing philosophic intuitions from ordinary folk. Questions of concern include: What intuitions do ordinary folk have about such concepts as agency, intentionality, responsibility, free will, knowledge, consciousness, and morality? Are the folk intuitively moral objectivists or moral relativists? When do the folk view someone as blameworthy? Do folk from different cultures or with different genders have different intuitions?

Topics covered in experimental philosophy are expanding. The main sections in the first volume (Knobe and Nichols, 2008) are:

(I) Cross-Cultural Differences in Intuitions
(II) Responsibility, Determinism, and Lay Intuitions
(III) Folk Psychology and Moral Cognition
(IV) The Future of Experimental Philosophy

The main sections in the second volume extend some of the discussions initiated in the first volume and also include new topics:

(I) Metaphilosophy
(II) Consciousness
(III) Metaethics
(IV) The Impact of Morality on Judgment
(V) Miscellaneous

Although the topic of gender does not show up in the section headings of the second volume, there is one paper in the “Miscellaneous” section by Wesley Buckwalter and Stephen Stich on findings of sex differences tied to certain philosophic intuitions.

Some of the new topics in the second volume include noteworthy work on intuitions about the nature and grounding of our intuitions about consciousness itself and about what kinds of objects/beings have consciousness. Heather Gray, Kurt Gray, and Daniel Wegner find that our folk judgments about what entities have consciousness can be grouped based on those things we judge to have agency (e.g., God) and those things we judge to have experiences (e.g., frogs). Justin Sytsma and Edouard Machery focus on conceptions of subjective experience and argue that philosophers and ordinary folk differ in how and when they attribute subjectively experienced mental states to other beings. Philosophers propose that subjective mental states have phenomenal properties (“what it is like” properties), whereas ordinary people do not group subjective mental states together as all having phenomenal properties. Rather, they “distinguish between the states that have a valence, such as pain, anger, and smelling banana, and the states that do not, such as seeing red and smelling isoamyl acetate” (104). Adam Arico, Brian Fiala, Robert Goldberg, and Shaun Nichols provide a more detailed account for the psychological processes involved in attributing conscious states to various types of entities. On their view, we tend to attribute conscious states to agents (more broadly construed than the agents discussed in Gray, Gray and Wegner), and we tend to identify entities as agents when the entities are perceived to have eyes and responsive behaviors.

In the section on metaethics, the contributors present and analyze experimental results on the degree to which and under what conditions people consider moral claims to be objectively versus relatively true. Based on their experimental findings, Geoffrey Goodwin and John Darley propose that people are most likely to be ethical objectivists. Hagop Sarkissian, John Park, David Tien, Jennifer Cole Wright, and Knobe propose, on the other hand, that when subjects are provided cultural contexts, they are more likely to be relativistic about ethical claims. It turns out that there is more complexity tied to intuitions about objectivism and subjectivism than early experimental procedures would lead us to believe.

Perhaps the most intriguing findings to date in experimental philosophy show that people’s moral judgments can affect judgments about intentional actions. Knobe has shown this effect in experiments using the following vignette:

The vice president of a company went to the chairman of the board and said, “We are thinking of starting a new program. It will help us increase profits, but it will also harm the environment.”

The chairman of the board answered, “I don’t care at all about harming the environment. I just want to make as much profit as I can. Let’s start the new program.”

They started the new program. Sure enough, the environment was harmed.

Knobe found that the intuition of most subjects concerning this vignette is that the chairman intentionally harmed the environment. However, subjects’ intuitions about intentionality are significantly altered when the word “harm” is replaced with “help”:

The vice president of a company went to the chairman of the board and said, “We are thinking of starting a new program. It will help us increase profits, and it will also help the environment.”

The chairman of the board answered, “I don’t care at all about helping the environment. I just want to make as much profit as I can. Let’s start the new program.”

They started the new program. Sure enough, the environment was helped.

The intuition of most subjects concerning this second vignette is that the chairman unintentionally helped the environment. Knobe’s paper on this experimental finding is in the first volume of Experimental Philosophy. His results have since been replicated, and in Section IV of the second volume, a number of researchers (Knobe, Mark Alicke, David Rose, Dori Bloom, Kevin Uttich, and Tania Lombrozo) further discuss and analyze the psychological processing underlying the impact of morality on our judgments.

The editors begin their second volume with a section on metaphilosophy and a doomsday piece by Antti Kauppinen entitled, “The Rise and Fall of Experimental Philosophy.” Kauppinen sees no benefit to a survey-based experimental approach to conceptual analysis. Instead, he defends traditional philosophers who analyze concepts by reflecting on ordinary linguistic practices and drawing on philosophical insights of other philosophers who have come before them. In spite of Kauppinen’s pessimistic proclamations about the fall of experimental philosophy, I expect that experimental philosophy is here to stay. I consider this to be a good thing.

Experimental philosophy is clearly maturing and expanding its scope. In the second volume, there is less anxiety and defensiveness expressed about the field’s legitimacy, and there are a number of high-quality, thought-provoking papers. I agree with much of Volume I’s opening chapter, “An Experimental Philosophy Manifesto,” and especially resonate with the view expressed therein that “many of the deepest questions of philosophy can only be properly addressed by immersing oneself in the messy, contingent, highly variable truths about how human beings really are.” Philosophers and psychologists have many fruitful collaborations ahead of them.

In spite of my optimism about the programmatic and methodological trajectory found in experimental philosophy to date, I remain uncertain about whether and to what degree experimental philosophy can or should be distinguished from empirical philosophy. In 2008, Jesse Prinz maintained that experimental philosophy focuses on philosophic intuitions of the folk and employs empirical results reached by professional philosophers, whereas, empirical philosophy employs empirical results reached by professional scientists (e.g., psychologists, neuroscientists, etc.). It’s true that much of experimental philosophy to date involves philosophers conducting their own survey-based experiments with undergraduate students serving as research subjects. Their goals included better understanding the “folk intuitions” of their students about free will, trolley problems, and so on. In fact, almost all of the experiment-focused articles in the first Knobe and Nichols volume were authored by professional philosophers who conducted their own survey-based experiments.2 In the second volume, the experiments are also primarily concerned with folk intuitions, and the methodologies are once again primarily survey-based. However, in this volume more than a third of the contributors (12 out of 30) are affiliated with departments of psychology. And in the second volume, some of the experiments are more methodologically sophisticated. For example, in their research into the folk psychology of consciousness, the team comprised of both philosophers and psychologists (Arico, Fiala, Goldberg, and Nichols) employed a timed property-attribution task using a psychology software tool. Because the work in the second volume is more inter-disciplinary and methodologically sophisticated, some of the distinctions between experimental philosophy and empirical philosophy appear to be blurring.

I think that a natural next step for experimental philosophy is for it to continue to expand in both scope and methodology. This may mean that it gently merges with empirical philosophy more generally and ceases to exist as a separate subfield of philosophy. Experimental philosophy as defined by Prinz may or may not be here to stay. The days may be numbered for philosophy experiments comprised of surveys distributed and analyzed by philosophy professors in their own undergraduate classrooms. This, too, I would consider to be a good thing. Science is best left to scientists or at the very least very-well-trained-in-science philosophers. Such philosophers are few and far between. I expect that in the future, professional scientists will closely collaborate with professional philosophers to conduct rigorous experiments that advance both philosophy and science.

Let me conclude my review with a brief discussion of women and experimental philosophy. It is interesting to note that all eighteen of the contributors to the first volume are male. And although four of the thirty contributors to the second volume are female, all of the female contributors are affiliated with departments of psychology. The eighteen philosophy contributors (i.e., those affiliated with departments of philosophy) are once again all male. Does this mean that no women philosophers are publishing high-quality work in experimental philosophy? As I noted above, it’s difficult to know who does and does not count as doing experimental philosophy as opposed to engaging in a more general approach to empirical philosophy. Knobe recently created a Wiki site listing graduate faculty who work in experimental philosophy. This list, too, is dominated by men, but does at least include a handful of women.

The content of the two volumes is also mostly devoid of work on intuitions tied to gender, race, stereotypes, implicit bias, and so on. Perhaps the contributors do not consider such intuitions and the psychological processes underlying them as central to philosophy. As I mention above, the second volume does include one piece by Buckwalter and Stich (in the final “Miscellaneous” section) on undergraduate gender differences in philosophical intuitions. They hypothesize that these differences could be contributors to the gender gap in philosophy. I will not elaborate here on my serious concerns about this particular article. Louise Antony has published a very careful and convincing critical piece3 of their findings and conclusions, which I recommend to all readers of this review. Nonetheless, I suggest that experimental philosophers make issues tied to sexist and racist psychologies more central to their research programs, and that they draw more extensively on the extant research on implicit bias, stereotype threat, and hurdles for women in academia — especially in fields where women are underrepresented, such as science, math, and economics. When this research is more closely examined, one finds that differences in intuitions, if they exist at all, are most likely the least of the reasons for a gender gap in philosophy. As Antony puts it, a “perfect storm” best models and accounts for the low numbers of women in philosophy. On the perfect storm account, there is “a kind of interaction effect among familiar kinds of sex discrimination that are operative throughout society, but that take on particular forms and force as they converge within the academic institution of philosophy.”4 Much more than apparent differences in philosophic intuitions needs to be researched in order to better account for the gender gap in philosophy.5

In sum, I commend Buckwalter and Stich for tackling difficult gender-related issues, but their work is only the tip of an iceberg. Here’s hoping that the third volume of experimental philosophy broadens its scope even more than the second volume by carefully and directly addressing issues of social justice.

1 Knobe, J. and S. Nichols (eds.) 2008. Experimental Philosophy, New York, New York: Oxford University Press, 2008, 244pp.

2 Fiery Cushman, who co-authored with Alfred Mele in the first volume, is the one exception. He is affiliated with the Department of Psychology at Harvard University.

3 Antony, L. 2012. “Different Voices or Perfect Storm: Why Are There So Few Women in Philosophy?” Journal of Social Philosophy, 43.3, Fall.

4 Antony, p. 231.

5 For a good example of additional research in experimental philosophy that challenges Buckwalter and Stich’s findings on gender differences in intuitions and their hypothesis that such differences help to explain the gender gap in philosophy, see Adleberg, T., Thompson, M., and Nahmias, E. 2014. “Do Men and Women have Different Philosophical Intuitions? Further Data.” Philosophical Psychology (online 2014).