Experimental Philosophy

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Joshua Knobe and Shaun Nichols (eds.), Experimental Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2008, 244pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195323269.

Reviewed by Frank Jackson, Princeton University


(Contributors: Joshua Knobe, Jonathan M. Weinberg, Shaun Nichols, Stephen P. Stich, Edouard Machery, Ron Mallon, Robert L. Woolfolk, John M. Doris, John M. Darley, Eddy Nahmias, Stephen G. Morris, Thomas Nadelhoffer, Jason Turner, Fiery Cushman, Alfred Mele, Jesse J. Prinz, Walter Sinnott-Armstrong, Ernest Sosa)

In Naming and Necessity (Blackwell, p. 91 of the 1980 printing) Saul Kripke observes that someone might determine the reference of 'Gödel' by saying -- 'By "Gödel" I shall mean the man, whoever he is, who proved the incompleteness of arithmetic', and goes on to say '… you can do this if you want to. There's nothing really preventing it. You can just stick to that determination. If that's what you do, then if Schmidt discovered the incompleteness of arithmetic you do refer to him when you say "Gödel did such and such"'. We should, I think, agree with Kripke. The only query we might raise is why he includes the word 'really'. There is nothing at all preventing us using 'Gödel' that way. Though, as Kripke immediately goes on to say (rightly), 'But that's not what most of us do'. What's the evidence for this last claim? Surely, part of the answer lies in our response to the Schmidt case. As everyone knows, Kripke describes a possible case in which someone called Schmidt proves the incompleteness of arithmetic but in which we have no inclination whatever to say that 'Gödel' refers to Schmidt.

Similarly, we should agree that the word 'water' might have been used to refer to XYZ on Twin Earth and to H2O on Earth. Hilary Putnam's Twin Earth case isn't an impossibility proof. Why then are so many confident that we don't use the word 'water' in this way? Part of the answer lies in their response to the Twin Earth case. They find it intuitively compelling that 'water' doesn't refer to XYZ. Similarly, we should agree that we might have used the word 'knowledge' for true justified belief. Part of the evidence that so many of us don't lies in the fact that so many of us find it obvious that the kinds of cases Gettier drew to our attention are not cases of knowledge, although they are cases of true justified belief.

I open my review of this important collection of papers with the above remarks to explain why I find the unfriendly reception the experimental philosophy movement receives in some quarters puzzling. Part -- part -- of what Kripke, Putnam and Gettier were doing was some experimental philosophy. They were canvassing responses to possible cases, and it was both contingent and a posteriori what those results might be. And it is common ground that the results they obtained are very important for much current work in the philosophy of language and epistemology. I am not saying that they saw themselves as experimental philosophers. I don't know the answer to that question. What I am saying is that it is hard to see how one could reasonably take very seriously what we might call the standard responses to the cases Kripke, Putnam and Gettier describe -- that 'Gödel' doesn't refer to Schmidt, that 'water' doesn't refer to XYZ, and that Gettier cases aren't cases of knowledge -- while thinking that it is a mistake for philosophers to make surveys of responses to possible cases.

Of course there are many philosophical questions that aren't responsive to surveys. What is striking about Gettier cases goes beyond the strong inclination many of us have to say that they aren't cases of knowledge. They reveal surprising facts. One might have expected that combining truth with justification would insulate a belief from being right by accident. Gettier cases show that this expectation is mistaken. This is something we learn independently of whether or not Gettier cases are cases of knowledge. In addition, Gettier cases invite reflection on the difference between the concepts we possess and the concepts it would be good to possess. Gettier cases tell us that it would be good to have a concept that excluded them (for it would be good to have a concept that excludes being right by accident), and this again is something we learn independently of whether or not Gettier cases are cases of knowledge. (Similar remarks apply to names. One might have expected that 'Gödel' and 'water' had to refer to whatever has the properties that Gödel and water, respectively, are most famous for. Kripke and Putnam showed that this expectation is a mistake. They also showed that it would be good to have words that worked as sources of information about baptised objects and that picked out kinds, respectively, and this is true independently of whether or not some word is or is not doing either job.)

Also, surveys don't tell us what to say about survey results. A number of the essays in this volume highlight sharp differences in responses to cases. Sometimes the differences are in responses from different subjects or groups of subjects to the very same case, and sometimes they are differences in responses to similar cases -- cases one might have expected to elicit the same or similar responses -- from the same subjects. The two kinds of case seem to me to raise rather different issues. I'll be concerned mainly with one, much discussed example of the first kind.

Weinberg, Nicholls and Stich, ('Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions', ch. 2 in this volume) report big differences in responses to a Gettier example. Most Westerners judge the example not to be a case of knowledge; most East Asians judge it to be a case of knowledge. This is a surprise given the reaction to Gettier cases in analytical philosophy departments. Although there has always been the odd student or colleague who insists that Gettier cases are cases of knowledge, they are few and far between. What should we say about the results Weinberg et al report?

One thing to say is that surveys are tricky, as any empirically-oriented social scientist knows. We need surveys but at the same time we need to fuss about their design, exactly how the questions are worded, and how the surveys are carried out, and we need to repeat them. The same points apply of course to the surveys I mentioned at the beginning of this review. Also we need to allow respondents to mull over and discuss their responses. Gettier cases are complex and what's of most philosophical interest are the considered responses of subjects. (Psychologists interested in charting quick-and-dirty ways of thinking may well be interested in the unconsidered responses.) Anyone who knows the feminist bank teller example knows that people can be led into giving a quick response to that example -- the response that it is more likely that Linda is a feminist bank teller than that she is a bank teller -- which they repudiate categorically on reflection. Of course, there's a fine line between allowing discussion and allowing authority figure effects. I think we should all await with interest the results of future surveys of responses to Gettier cases carried out with suitable refinements and enhancements.

Suppose that the additional surveys are carried out, the methodology is impeccable but the big difference in responses remains. What to say? I think we should say that (many) East Asians have a concept of knowledge that differs from ours. They use 'knowledge' to make a different classification from the one we make. As it might be, they use 'knowledge' for cases of true, justified belief. We might seek to convince them that our concept is a better one for epistemology, or that they should supplement theirs with ours, but that's a separate issue. It is an empirical question whether or not their concept is the same as ours, and the results of impeccably conducted surveys would seem very much the right sort of evidence to show that their concept is not ours. (In the final paper in this volume, Sosa says, if I understand him aright, something similar from a different perspective on the role of thought experiments in general.)

In 'An Experimental Philosophy Manifesto', ch. 1 in this volume, the editors seem to suggest experimental philosophers can steer clear of questions about the nature of concepts in the following words:

In one sense, then, it seems that the task of experimental philosophy is considerably less demanding than that of conceptual analysis. As long as we can offer an account of the internal psychological processes that underlie our judgments, we do not need to find necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of the concept in particular cases. (p. 5)

But there remains the question of what judgment someone is making, the content of their judgment. Subjects' responses to the kinds of surveys reported in the experimental philosophy literature, including in this volume, are judgments about cases. Subjects are presented with vignettes -- possible cases given in words or sometimes in words and pictures -- and asked questions like, Is this a case of intentional action? Does true temp know? When subjects reply, as it might be, that the action is intentional, or that true temp doesn't know, they tell us what they believe about these cases. Of course we can ask about the psychological origins of these beliefs, and these are good questions to ask, but nevertheless part of the story about why subjects respond as they do concerns what they believe about a case. A central part of any account of why someone believes as they do concerns what it is that they believe. And it is what they believe about the case they give voice to when they use words like 'intentional' and 'knowledge'. This means that differences in what people use these words for, differences in the concepts they use the words for, are always a live option to explain differences in responses to surveys.

You might think that there is another, and perhaps a better, way to go: take the differences in results as casting doubt on using intuitions about possible cases. The method has turned out not to be reliable. At most it is reliable within one or another social or ethnic group, and there's no non-arbitrary basis for preferring the intuitions of one group over those of the others. This appears to be how Weinberg et al are thinking of matters (thus the phrase 'intuition driven romanticism' in describing the position they question). I think this would be a mistake. It is treating intuitions as if they were the deliverances of some kind of 'intuition module' in the brain that's been shown to be unreliable with respect to, say, Gettier cases. But when we contemplate a Gettier case, we are asking whether or not the case as described counts as a case of knowledge. We don't introspect; we direct our attention to the case and ask what we believe about it. There is nothing more to having an intuition about a possible case than judging that the case is thus and so. The point here is like a point often made about judgements of color. Of course the fact that something looks red is frequently our reason for holding that it is red. But we don't introspect our color experience; we examine the object. The nature of our color experience when looking at, say, a ripe tomato is nothing over and above the putative nature of the tomato.

Weinberg et al discuss the suggestion that we might respond to marked divergences in responses to Gettier cases (and other cases; I'm focussing the discussion) by adopting 'epistemic relativism', and it may be that they think, or would think, of the response I defend a few paragraphs back as a kind of relativism. They argue that although a limited form of epistemic relativism may be acceptable ('the one avowed relativist among us is still prepared to defend some forms of relativism', p. 35), we do not want to conclude from divergences in responses by different groups that 'the epistemic norms appropriate for the rich are quite different from the epistemic norms appropriate for the poor, and that the epistemic norms appropriate for white people are different from the norms appropriate for people of color'. As they say, this conclusion would be 'preposterous'. But of course to allow that different groups might have different concepts of knowledge isn't relativism in the objectionable sense. What's being allowed isn't that there is a single concept of knowledge for which it is a relative matter whether or not it applies to some given case. What's being allowed is that there might be two different concepts, for each of which it is a non-relative matter whether or not it applies to some given case.

I have concentrated on a small number of central questions prompted by the some of the papers in this volume. Let me close by recommending the volume as a whole.