Experiments in Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Kwame Anthony Appiah, Experiments in Ethics, Harvard UP, 2008, 274pp., $15.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780674034570.

Reviewed by John M. Doris, Washington University in St. Louis and Jesse J. Prinz, City University of New York Graduate Center



The past decade has witnessed a remarkable expansion of work at the intersection of philosophical ethics and the human sciences. As evinced by the recent profusion of surveys and anthologies treating the new — or newly revitalized — fields going under such names as experimental philosophy, empirically informed ethics, and moral psychology, there is now a large and thriving literature, covering an extensive range of topics: responsibility, free will, moral judgment, rationality, motivation, character, innateness, evaluative diversity, altruism, well-being, intentionality, intuitions, and emotion (Andreou 2007; Doris and Stich 2005, 2006; Doris et al. forthcoming; Knobe and Nichols 2008; Nahmias et al. forthcoming; Sinnott-Armstrong 2007 a, b, c).

With the publication of Anthony Appiah’s shrewdly argued and beautifully written Experiments in Ethics, those wondering over what the fuss is about have an engaging entree to the issues. Appiah’s goal is not so much to advance a new theory, but rather to demonstrate that the recent empirical turn demands attention. In some circles, empirically infused approaches to ethics have been regarded as irrelevant or confused, but Appiah’s study makes such recalcitrance look seriously underinformed. However, Appiah does not mean to discredit conventional philosophical practice. Instead, he advocates a kind of methodological pluralism, where ethical reflection draws on both the conceptual tools long familiar in analytic philosophy and the empirical insights provided by experimentalists working within and without philosophy departments.

Experiments in Ethics consists of one introductory chapter and a final methodological chapter, bookending three substantive chapters on issues where the empirical turn has been highly visible: character, intuition, and diversity. It would be unreasonable to expect from what Appiah modestly calls his “little book” a comprehensive survey of the field, or even a comprehensive treatment of the topics included, but Appiah’s sensitive examination of the material he does discuss both advances our thinking on the issues and gives a sense of why the wider field is worth thinking about (1).

In the philosophical tradition of celebration-by-criticism, we’ll now offer a very selective critique, focusing on two issues where one of us has a personal investment, character (Doris 1998, 2002, 2005) and the role of emotions (Prinz 2006, 2007). Our first complaint is a charge of commission: we contend that Appiah undersells the implications of experimental psychology for folk and philosophical conceptions of character (cf. Machery forthcoming). Our second complaint is a charge of omission: we contend that a maximally rich understanding of moral psychology requires more detailed attention to the emotions than Appiah is able to give. After some remarks on these topics, we’ll close with some more general speculations on the import of the empirical turn.


Recently, much has been written about the purportedly dire implications of “situationist” social psychology for the conceptions of moral character prominent in contemporary virtue ethics.1 The difficulty concerns globalist moral psychologies, which are distinguished by the expectation that behavior is ordered by robust traits. The virtues are paradigmatic examples of robust traits: if one possesses the virtue of courage, for example, one is expected consistently to behave courageously when it is appropriate to do so, despite the presence of contrary inducements. But there exist quantities of empirical evidence indicating that behavior varies quite radically with slight situational variations, such as whether the actor is in a hurry, has enjoyed a modest bit of good fortune, or observes an emergency in a group or alone. Given this situational variability, people’s behavior is likely to be quite inconsistent with regard to the patterns expected on familiar trait categories, such as those embodied in philosophical writing on the virtues.

The situationist argument can be cast as a modus tollens:

(1) If behavior is typically ordered by robust traits, systematic observation will reveal pervasive behavioral consistency.

(2) Systematic observation does not reveal pervasive behavioral consistency.

(3) Behavior is not typically ordered by robust traits.

Proponents of arguments in this vicinity may contend that philosophical understandings of character, in so far as they’re committed to robust traits, are empirically inadequate. It may be further alleged that such arguments have normative implications, particularly regarding the competitive advantages (or disadvantages) exhibited by virtue theoretic approaches to normative ethics.

Debate continues, and defenders of virtue ethics have forwarded numerous responses.2 Appiah’s position here is characteristically refined: he endorses the empirical critique of globalism (albeit somewhat guardedly), while attempting to soften its normative implications. This is an appealing approach, acknowledging a compelling scientific tradition, while preserving the core insight of an equally compelling — perhaps to many, more compelling — ethical tradition. As with other attractive theoretical and ideological rapprochements, the prospects here seem to us uncertain; like religion and evolution, virtue and social psychology may never be fully reconciled.3

On Appiah’s understanding, the situationist charges that people are “inclined to overestimate disposition and underestimate situation” in explaining behavior (50). (Here, as elsewhere, Appiah is surefooted; he cautions against distortions, which have sometimes hobbled discussion, to the effect that situationists claim traits “don’t exist” 50.4) Appiah contends — rightly, we think — that both folk and virtue theoretic psychology manifest globalist conceptions of character, and he accepts the situationist critique of such conceptions (40, 45, 70). But Appiah eventually appears to part company with the critics, arguing that globalist conceptions of character are not the ones that matter for virtue ethics; the enduring insight of the tradition is that “[i]ndividual moments of compassion and honesty makes our lives better, even if we are not compassionate through and through” (70).

This observation seems hard to deny, and the situationist will not want to deny it (Doris 2002: 114-17, 164-7). For surely human lives contain moments of compassion, and those moments matter, and matter very much, even if character is not all that has been hoped. Then is there a fight to be had? Appiah seems to us ambivalent. At the end of a chapter substantially devoted to developing, often in a quite pointed fashion, a critique of globalist character psychology, Appiah closes with a section entitled “Why Virtue Matters.” Curiously, and perhaps tellingly, this short section contains as much discussion of situationism as of virtue.5 Yet Appiah ends by arguing that the "conjunction of virtue ethics and situationism makes it easier both to avoid doing what murders do and to avoid being what murders are." What to make of this irenic conjunction?

Certain lessons of social psychology and allied disciplines seem fairly clear, if not easily implemented: human beings are morally frail, and must work — and work together — to engender circumstances such that this frailty does not degenerate, as it so often has, into something terribly ugly. The role of virtue in Appiah’s conjunction is less plain. He clearly thinks virtue has a central role in ethical reflection, and seems especially attracted to a Millian conception (noting, rightly, that Mill’s insights on virtue have sometimes been obscured by contemporary dichotomizations of Utilitarianism and Aristotelianism [66-7]). A natural suggestion for developing this role, and one that Appiah seems attracted to — although he is suspicious of morphing the discourse of virtue into a set of “fast and frugal” action guiding heuristics — is that appropriately attending to ideals of virtue may somehow make people better, perhaps by focusing aspirations “on what kind of people we hope to be” (56-62, 72).

If, however, one is convinced by Appiah’s critique of globalism, and discards the notion of virtue ethics as a guide to developing appropriately robust character traits, one will require detailed arguments regarding the advantages of virtue theoretic ideals as materials for ethical reflection (56). Do they make people behave better? Are they easier to learn and disseminate? Are they less likely to be co-opted by the fanatical, intolerant, or hypocritical? We don’t suggest there couldn’t be compelling answers to such questions. We do say this makes a big job. Too big, obviously, for Appiah (or anyone else) to undertake in a single chapter. But in fact, we think there are reasons to question the promise of such an undertaking, even if space were unconstrained — reasons derived from Appiah’s perceptive writing on race.

Appiah (1996) has at times seemed tempted by eliminativism about racial categorization.6 One of his motivations is the historical connection of discourse on race and the doctrine of racialism — a scientifically discredited association of superficial morphological characteristics, such as skin tone and cranial shape, with important inherited characteristics, such as cognitive and moral attributes (Appiah 1996: 56). Like Appiah, we believe that the best science demonstrates that racialism is, to put it politely, bunk. Is there a way of dissolving the association of race and racialism, of reforming the discourse of race such that it is more psychologically credible? As Appiah (1996: 73-4) notes, there may be scientifically respectable candidates for the “referent of race,” such as “reproductively isolated local populations”; perhaps people could simply take care to invoke only such referents in discussions of race.

Trouble is, the history will not go away; such a reformed usage has very little to do with how the term has long been deployed in political, moral, and (perhaps to a lesser extent) scientific discourse. Indeed, on the proposed sanitization of race, Appiah observes, a good candidate for a race in the US might be the Amish, but the status of this group is hardly a conspicuous topic in the “conversation on race” in America. However, the worry is not really that in proceeding this way we’d have changed the subject, it’s that we’d not have changed the subject: the racialist connotations of race talk are too historically ingrained for talk of race to escape them — no matter how carefully and explicitly such talk is qualified.

Compelling considerations about empowering political identities notwithstanding (Appiah 1996: 98-9), we think this argument deserves to be taken very seriously. Nevertheless our present point does not directly concern the debate between eliminativists and preservationists about racial categorization. It’s just this: if you are attracted to the form of eliminativist argument just described, as Appiah is, and you’re attracted to the empirical critique of globalism, as Appiah is, you might want to take seriously eliminativism about character.7

Duly chastised by situationism, one might talk of character and virtue only in carefully qualified ways, and assiduously avoid, and indeed explicitly warn against, misleading globalist associations.8 But there are historical associations here too, and given that they’ve endured over more than two millennia, we might expect these associations to be rather well entrenched. History is never easily outrun, but all the more so when it has such a considerable head start. Indeed, it is hard, even for us, to read Appiah’s eloquent descriptions of the virtues without being drawn to globalist associations. Although we are not here agitating for eliminativism about character, the difficulty of eschewing such associations may counsel for elimination, rather than reformation. Probably the societal costs of “slipping” into racialism are much greater than those of “slipping” into globalism. Yet the potential hazards that misleading psychological theory poses for ethical reflection should not be taken lightly: empirical falsehood too often abets ethical falsehood, much as it has in the case of race. It is of course difficult to say, with confidence, what the likelihood of, and the cost of, globalist lapses might be; nevertheless, we should require further argument before stopping the critique of character short of eliminativism.


In both pre-theoretical reflection and philosophical theorizing, intuitions — roughly, more or less immediate responses to particular cases[9] — appear to inform and constrain moral judgment, most conspicuously in the form of responses to the “thought experiments” and “intuition pumps” that are so central to contemporary philosophical method. Like other recent writers, Appiah voices grave concern about the status of moral intuitions.10 These responses, it turns out, have a basis in emotions, but the emotions are unreliable in a variety of ways, meaning that the epistemic status of moral intuitions is, at best, highly uncertain. In articulating this difficulty, Appiah focuses on a range of findings that reveal disquieting inconsistencies in moral judgment — a phenomenon that might be called the problem of inner pluralism.

Examples include the following:

Framing Effects: Whether a policy is judged right or wrong may depend on how it is described; when considering whether to adopt a policy, people appear risk-averse if they focus on potential gains, and risk-prone if they focus on losses (Tversky and Kahneman 1981).

Proximity Effects: Whether people will countenance sacrificing one life to save others, as in the venerable family of Trolley Problems, may vary according to whether the agent makes physical contact with the victim. For example, people are more inclined to judge that a sacrifice is permitted when the sacrifice involves the agent pulling a lever, at a distance, as opposed to pushing, hands on, the person to be sacrificed (Greene et al. 2009).

Concreteness Effects: Attributions of responsibility for a moral transgression can be mitigated when people realize that an agent’s actions were externally determined, but the mitigation may evaporate when an especially repugnant transgression is described vividly and concretely (Nichols and Knobe 2007).

When confronted with such cases, it is tempting to resolve the apparent inconsistencies by concluding that one of the two conflicting responses is mistaken. For example, Greene (2007) thinks it a mistake to condemn pushing a man into a trolley’s path in order to save five others; this response, he argues, is based on emotions and emotions, at least in this case, should be mistrusted. Similarly, Nichols and Knobe (2007) suggest that the tendency to hold people responsible for causally determined repugnant behaviors may be a “performance error”; vividly described cases trigger emotional responses that swamp the salience of morally relevant causal constraints.11 Emotions may likewise be the culprit in framing effects; when a scenario is presented to subjects in terms of potential losses, as opposed to potential gains, more anxiety may result, and that may have an impact on decision-making.

Appiah thinks this rather too easy, as do we (116). While he doesn’t develop the point in detail, Appiah reminds us that the variegated admixture of moral intuitions is not easily titrated into “rational” deliverances of cognition and “irrational” deliverances of emotion. (Even on the unlikely supposition that the implied polarities are sustainable.) In the case of trolleys, Appiah notes that squeamishness about hands-on killing may be a good thing, overall, even if it sometimes prevents people from approving of, or pursuing, outcomes that might be recommended on highly plausible utilitarian grounds (98).12 With regard to responsibility, one might suppose that something like “strict liability” is a morally defensible response to sufficiently repugnant actions, even if the actors are plausibly thought to occupy excusing conditions.13 In such cases emotions are not obviously implicated in error; indeed, it may sometimes be emotions that caution against moral alchemies such as transmuting torture into “enhanced interrogation.”

Of course, emotions may sometimes be based on factual errors or extraneous sources of emotion-induction. For example, the perceived immorality of a behavior may increase when people are hypnotized to feel disgust or are seated at a filthy desk (Schnall et al. 2008). One therefore must be careful that moral intuitions are not being distorted by emotions that are morally irrelevant to the situation under consideration. But we agree with Appiah that the potential for bias does not entail that emotions should be exorcized form moral judgment. In fact, to strip morality of passion might leave it with a role akin to that played by etiquette in much of modernity (and post-modernity) — a system of rules with little motivational force. Then if Greene and colleagues think that some utilitarian judgments are made without emotional impetus, they may have gone too far. Consider again the person who elects to save five lives by sacrificing one; presumably, this utilitarian agent is driven by compassion for the needy five, and perhaps she would be outraged at those who do not similarly intervene.

Emotions seem to play a role in grounding utilitarian intuitions, but, as Greene and his associates have shown, emotions also play a role in grounding the deontological intuitions that can come into conflict with the Millian calculus. Now we’ve a kind of predicament. If emotionally grounded moral intuitions are inconsistent, then how are we to make choices when evaluations conflict? Appiah might say that we need to live with the inconsistencies and take comfort in the fact that they don’t arise in every case, or even many cases (98). The difficulty with such a position is that, in addition to inner pluralism, there is outer pluralism. Even when a person’s values are self-consistent on a given point, there will very likely be another person whose values differ. The empirical evidence for this is famously abundant; while some philosophers have remarked on experimental evidence for evaluative diversity (e.g., Doris and Stich 2005, Doris and Plakias 2007), the most philosophically compelling evidence may come from the ethnographic record (Harman 1996, Prinz 2008). Anthropology, not to mention electoral politics, suggests that striking evaluative variation is the norm; indeed, there may be no uncontested moral value. For example, despite the oceans of ink spilt condemning such practices, many states and their citizens endorse torture, gender discrimination, and slavery (there are more people living in slavery now than at any other point in human history). Of course, such cases endlessly multiply: cannibalism has been practiced on a massive scale, homosexuals have been brutally murdered, and young children have been put to work in factories.

Perhaps some of the moral practices that seem egregious (at least from the present authors’ perspective!) are based on factual errors; for example, American chattel slavery made much use of scientific racism (Fredrickson 1971). Nevertheless there are many abhorrent values that do not trade on obvious factual mistakes. Public torture (such as breaking on the wheel) was accepted and enjoyed by “civilized” European societies well into the 18th century, but critics of torture did not make any relevant scientific discoveries that were unavailable to their predecessors (Langbein 1977). Perhaps, instead of values trailing behind facts, facts trail behind values; is the rejection of racist pseudoscience due more to scientific discovery or to change in moral outlook?

The prevalence of outer pluralism raises challenging practical problems. Should polygamy be permitted? How about mortuary cannibalism? Should governments intervene to stop vaginal circumcision? And so on. As a practical and political matter, a vivid appreciation of pervasive evaluative diversity erodes moral confidence: how can we justifiably intervene, if we can’t be assured our intervention is justified? But the difficulties are not only practical; they also illuminate theoretical difficulties that admit of no easy solution. When values conflict, is there a neutral theoretical perspective from which they may be resolved? An invocation of Kantian precepts on human dignity appeals to some philosophers, but to social historians, Kant is not an ahistorical spokesperson for pure reason, but a historically situated Lutheran whose first principles need not be universally endorsed.14 Kant gives us a set of personal and culturally shaped intuitions, just as do Aristotle, Confucius, Hobbes, and Mill. And history tends to filter those thinkers whose sensibilities depart too radically from current sentiments, through neglect or convenient mis-readings (remember that Plato was Hitler’s favorite philosopher).

One might seek an acultural Archimedean point in nature, perhaps appealing to innate moral capacities or “evolutionary ethics.” This, to put it mildly, makes demanding work. First, we think the case for innate morality has been underwhelming.15 It’s hard to construct a poverty of the stimulus argument when some parents are known to correct children’s behavior every 7.5 minutes of waking life (Hoffman 2001). Unlike grammatical mistakes, which often go uncorrected, kids are regularly subject to punishment and disapproval, and may experience vicarious distress, “caught” from their victims, when they do something that harms another individual. Second, on current nativist theories, innate moral rules are schematic, like rules of grammar, and the substance gets filled in differently by different cultures. Third, even if there were innate universals, it does not follow that they enjoy normative authority. Should people adopt the moral values of hunters and gathers (which, incidentally, vary greatly)? Should people act more like their primate cousins, such as chimpanzees, who steal, kill, rape juveniles, and show extreme preference for ingroups and kin? These behaviors may be innately tolerated, but that is scant reason to honor them with normative endorsement.

The practical problem of diversity, then, runs with the theoretical problem of objectivity. One way out of this predicament is to suppose that it’s not, after all, much of a predicament — or in any event, not the sort of predicament that stops the show. Such, we think, is Appiah’s position:

Philosophers often suggest that the question of whether or not, when we make moral judgments, we express beliefs about the way the world really is morally, is a hugely important question. From the point of view of getting on with your life, though, it’s really crucial only if you’re a particularly devoted meta-ethicist. (182)

This kind of view — call it metaethical quietism — is not without appeal, especially when one observes, with Appiah, that most of what metaethical disputants “want to say about first-order ethics is the same,” and where they differ, “it’s almost never because they disagree about metaphysics” (183). When all the theorizing is over, the metaethicist must, like the rest of us, get out of bed, pull on her trousers — one leg at a time — and do the best she can; as Appiah says, “we will still be faced with the challenge of making our lives” (184).

Metaethical quietism is contested (e.g., Sturgeon 1986), but the observations motivating it have undeniable punch. Still, we’re not sure if we can maintain our metaethical silence, even as we’re pulling on our trousers. For the boundary between the theoretical and the practical is not hermetically sealed. As regards the present case, we’ve already intimated why this is so: a broad range of empirical considerations have the effect, if we take them as seriously as we might, of shaking our moral confidence, for we learn that we are navigating, with frail cognitive equipment and disputable theoretical aids, deeply contested evaluative terrain. Surely, as we’ve already intimated, this realization has practical implications: why get out of bed and work for justice, if one is not tolerably confident that one is not thereby contributing to injustice?

Surely Appiah is aware of this; as he archly describes it, his philosophy, at least when packaged for the consumption of the passenger in the next airplane seat, is that “everything is more complicated than you thought” (198). We suspect this sense of complexity is fueled, at least in part, by his rich sense of the empirical. But why then rest with quietism, a philosophical sensibility not noted for fretting complications? Might Appiah see a more revisionary critique of moral philosophy coming out of empirical ethics?

What Now?

Thus far, we’ve endorsed Appiah’s critiques of character and intuitions. He is right that empirical perspectives on ethics pressure the understanding of persons that has been enshrined in Western moral philosophy, and exposes deep inconsistencies in moral intuitions. In both instances, however, we’ve also voiced a complaint: we contend that Appiah understates the import of empirical ethics, eschewing some of the more unsettling implications of the very arguments he so elegantly makes. To make this point more explicit, we want to finish by distinguishing a number of views about, as Appiah puts it in his last chapter, “the ends” of empirically informed ethics. We will try to situate Appiah among the range of options, and recommend a somewhat different perspective.

One possible attitude is that empirical approaches vindicate familiar moral judgments, norms and practices (perhaps after a bit of philosophical systematization). On this perspective, experiments in ethics leave things much as they were before, but with firmer foundations. (This approach faces pressing issues about evaluative diversity, but fortunately, our taxonomic ambitions do not require that we address them.) For instance, empirical work might show that human beings often enough meet standards of ordinary decency; Batson’s (1991) experimental demonstrations of altruistic behavior take this form, as does some work in evolutionary ethics, such as Wright’s (2005) arguments that human beings are fitted by nature to be good. In a similar spirit, one might try to vindicate morality empirically by arguing that the posits of classical moral theories are real, as in Miller’s (2003) defense of character traits.

A second option is to reconceptualize morality. Perhaps moral theory is founded on infirm empirical suppositions, but this should not be taken to discredit familiar moral views. Rather, the empirical ethicist should find ways to leave those views more or less intact, and place them on more secure empirical footing. Merrit’s (2000) “Humean” virtue ethics, which attempts to preserve the normative centrality of virtue while jettisoning the empirically troubled notion of robust character traits that imperils more familiar Aristotelian theories, is an example of this approach.

A third option counsels regulation: perhaps empirical work can be used to indentify various constraints on moral theory. Flanagan’s (1991: 15, 32) “psychological realism” is an example of this view: in constructing their theories, moral philosophers should be constrained by what is psychologically possible for human organisms — in a slogan, moral oughts are disciplined by psychological cans.16 The result may be revisionary: as Appiah implies, empirical research indicates that people may need to change their tactics for cultivating good behavior, and the conditions under which moral deliberation takes place might need to be adjusted to avoid bias (71). But these revisions, while they may not leave present theory and practice unchanged, need not imply any major upheavals. As we’ve seen, for example, Appiah finds much that is good in the traditional discourses of character, even if the empirical work indicates that the practice of promoting, and the prospects for achieving, good character might be different than one antecedently thought.

This distinguishes Appiah from those who use empirical findings to advocate elimination of morality, or some central aspect of morality. Advocates of such radical views might include Joyce (2006) who argues for error theory — the view that ordinary moral beliefs are fundamentally mistaken — on the basis of evolutionary arguments. Joyce does not say what to do about the error, and, depending on his advice, his radical metaethics might be combined with a practical outlook that’s more reconceptualist. For example, he might argue that morality is an inevitable illusion and should be left alone (cf. Ruse 1991). A “harder” eliminativism can be found in Nietzsche’s genealogical arguments: people are mistaken about the nature and origin of morality, and that realization should usher in a major transfiguration of values (see Prinz 2007: chap. 6). A more restricted form of eliminativism is advocated by Greene (2002), who interprets his own brain imaging results as establishing that deontological intuitions are based on emotional processes, while consequentialist intuitions are based on rational processes; he argues that deontology should therefore give way to consequentialism.

We’re not recommending anything so radical as Nietzsche, or even Greene. We are suggesting that the vindication, reconceptualization, and regulation approaches to the empirical evidence, while they may be apt in some cases, in other cases fail to properly assimilate its import. We are inclined to say, rather grandly, that empirical work demands a reconstruction of morality. This may involve the elimination of certain constructs, such as robust character traits, but it may also counsel a shift from moral theory and practice understood as an exercise of the deliberative self.

The focus of Western moral philosophy has been on questions like “How should I act?” or “What sort of person should I be?” From a first person perspective, these questions are affected by psychological phenomena that make them difficult to address in a satisfactory way. One possible implication of this is that there is no way to assimilate adequately the third and first personal perspectives, because the “third personal” lesson of the human sciences is tantamount to a radical critique of the integrity of the “first personal” subjective point of view. This may be taken to indicate that individual deliberative agents are not sustainable “units of moral analysis.” If so, philosophical ethics may need to redirect its focus to the suprapersonal level; for example, on how to organize and arrange institutions and collectives. This focus, in turn, may break down disciplinary divisions between moral and political philosophy. In fact, this is just the sort of approach we see in Appiah’s other work. At day’s end, our critique of his wonderful Experiments in Ethics amounts to this: the book would be enriched by drawing a more explicit link between the empirical turn in ethics and the philosophical project Appiah himself so inspirationally exemplifies. Of course, this observation merely instantiates a truism of philosophical writing: one can’t have the last word in one place, or any place. It does not, then, detract from our recommendation: Experiments in Ethics is required reading for anyone who wants to learn about, or learn more about, the burgeoning literature on empirical approaches to ethics.17


Adams, R. M. 2006. A Theory of Virtue: Excellence in Being For the Good. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Andreou, C. 2007. “Morality and Psychology.” Philosophy Compass 2: 46-55.

Annas, J. 2005. “Comments on John Doris’ Lack of Character.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73: 636-47.

Appiah, K, A. 1996. “Race, Culture, Identity: Misunderstood Connections.” In K. A. Appiah & A. Gutmann, Color Conscious: The Political Morality of Race. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Appiah, K. A. 2008. Experiments in Ethics. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Arpaly, N. 2005. "Comments on Lack of Character by John Doris." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73: 643-7.

Batson, C. D. 1991. The Altruism Question: Toward a Social-Psychological Answer. Hillsdale, NJ: Lawrence Erlbaum Associates.

Doris, J. M. 1998. “Persons, Situations, and Virtue Ethics.” Noûs 32: 504-530.

Doris, J. M. 2002. Lack of Character: Personality and Moral Behavior. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Doris, J. M. 2005. “Precís” and “Replies: Evidence and Sensibility.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 72: 632-635, 656-677.

Doris, J. M. 2006. “Out of Character: On the Psychology of Excuses in the Criminal Law.” In Hugh La Follette (Ed.), Ethics in Practice. Oxford: Blackwell.

Doris, J. M., Knobe, J. & Woolfolk, R. L. 2007. “Variantism about Responsibility.” Philosophical Perspectives: Philosophy of Mind 7: 337-348.

Doris, J. M., & The Moral Psychology Research Group (eds.). forthcoming. The Moral Psychology Handbook. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Doris, J. M. & Murphy, D. 2007. “From My Lai to Abu Ghraib: The Moral Psychology of Atrocity.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 31: 25-55.

Doris, J. M. & Plakias, A. 2007. “How to Argue About Disagreement: Evaluative Diversity and Moral Realism.” In W. Sinnott-Armstrong (Ed.), Moral Psychology, vol. 2: The Cognitive Science of Morality (pp. 303-332). Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Doris, J. M. & Stich, S. P. 2005. “As a Matter of Fact: Empirical Perspectives on Ethics.” In F. Jackson & M. Smith (Eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Contemporary Philosophy. (pp 114-152). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Doris, J. M. & Stich, S. P. 2006. “Moral Psychology: Empirical Approaches,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2003 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL =http://plato.stanford.edu/entries/moral-psych-emp/.

Flanagan, O. 1991. Varieties of Moral Personality: Ethics and Psychological Realism. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Fredrickson, G. M. 1971. The Black Image in The White Mind: The Debate on Afro-American Character and Destiny, 1817-1914. New York: Harper & Row.

Greene, J. D. (2002). The Terrible, Horrible, No Good, Very Bad Truth About Morality and What To Do About It. Doctoral dissertation, Department of Philosophy, Princeton University.

Greene, J. D. 2007. “The Secret Joke of Kant’s Soul.” In. W. P. Sinnott-Armstrong (Ed.), Moral Psychology, Vol. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality: Emotion, Disease, and Development. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Greene, J.D., Cushman, F.A., Stewart. L.E., Lowenberg, K., Nystrom, L.E., and Cohen, J.D. 2009. “Pushing moral buttons: The interaction between personal force and intention in moral judgment.” Cognition, 111: 364-371.

Harman, G. 1996. “Moral Relativism.” In G. Harman & J. J. Thomson, Moral Relativism and Moral Objectivity: Great Debates in Philosophy (pp. 1-64). Oxford: Blackwell.

Harman, G. 1999. “Moral Philosophy Meets Social Psychology: Virtue Ethics and the Fundamental Attribution Error.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 99: 315-31.

Harman, G. 2000. “The Nonexistence of Character Traits,” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 100: 223-226.

Hoffman, M. 2001. Empathy and Moral Development: Implications for Caring and Justice. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Horowitz, T. 1998. “Philosophical Intuitions and Psychological Theory.” In M. DePaul & W. Ramsey (Eds.), Rethinking Intuition: The Psychology of Intuition and its Role in Philosophical Inquiry (pp. 143-160). Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.

Joyce, R. 2006. The Evolution of Morality. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Kamtekar, R. 2004. “Situationism and Virtue Ethics on the Content of Our Character.” Ethics 114: 458-91.

Kelly, D., Machery, E. & Mallon, R. forthcoming. “Race and Racial Cognition.” In J. M. Doris & The Moral Psychology Research Group (eds.), The Moral Psychology Handbook. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Knobe, J. & Nichols, S. 2008. Experimental Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kupperman, J. J. 2001. “The Indispensability of Character.” Philosophy 76: 239-50.

Langbein, J. H. 1977. Torture and the Law of Proof: Europe and England in the Ancien Regimé. Chicago, IL: University of Chicago Press.

Machery, E. forthcoming. “The Bleak Implications of Moral Psychology.” Neuroethics.

MacIntyre, A. 2007. After Virtue (3rd edn.). Notre Dame: Notre Dame University Press.

MacLean, N. 2006. Freedom Is Not Enough: The Opening of the American Workplace. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

MacLean, N. 2009. “Neo-Confederacy vs. the New Deal: The Regional Utopia of the Modern American Right.” In J. Crespino & M. Lassiter (eds.) The End of Southern History? New York: Oxford University Press.

Meritt, M., Doris, J. M., & Harman, G. forthcoming. “Character.” In J. M. Doris & The Moral Psychology Research Group (eds.), The Moral Psychology Handbook. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Merritt, M. 2000. “Virtue Ethics and Situationist Personality Psychology.” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 3: 365-383.

Miller, C. 2003. “Social Psychology and Virtue Ethics.” The Journal of Ethics 7: 365-392.

Montmarquet, J. 2003. “Moral Character and Social Science Research.” Philosophy 78: 355-68.

Nadlehoffer, T. Nahmias, E., & Nichols, S. (eds.) forthcoming. Moral Psychology: Historical and Contemporary Readings. Hoboken, NJ: Wiley-Blackwell.

Nichols, S., & Knobe, J. 2007. “Moral Responsibility and Determinism: The Cognitive Science of Folk Intuitions.” Noûs 4:663-685.

Prinz, J. J. 2006. “The Emotional Basis of Moral Judgments.” Philosophical Explorations 9: 29-43.

Prinz, J. J. 2007. The Emotional Construction of Morals. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Prinz, J. J. 2008. “Against Moral Nativism.” In M. Bishop and D. Murphy (Eds.) Stich and His Critics. Oxford: Blackwell.

Ruse, M. 1991. “The Significance of Evolution.” In P. Singer (Ed.) A Companion to Ethics (pp. 500-510). Oxford: Blackwell.

Schnall, S., Haidt, J., Clore, G. L., & Jordan, A. H. 2008. “Disgust as Embodied Moral Judgment.” Personality and Social Psychology Bulletini 34: 1096-1109.

Sinnott-Armstrong, W. P. 2005. “Moral Intuitionism Meets Empirical Psychology.” In T. Horgan & M. Timmons (Eds.). Metaethics After Moore. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Sinnott-Armstrong, W. P. 2007. “Framing Moral Intuitions.” In W. P. Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Volume 2: The Cognitive Science of Morality. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2007a. Moral Psychology, v. 1: The Evolution of Morality. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2007b. Moral Psychology, v. 2: The Cognitive Science of Morality. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Sinnott-Armstrong, W. 2007c. Moral Psychology, v. 3: The Neuroscience of Morality. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Solomon, R. 2003. “Victims of Circumstances? A Defense of Virtue Ethics in Business.” Business Ethics Quarterly 13: 43-62.

Solomon, R. 2005. “What’s Character Got to Do with It?” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 73: 648-655.

Stanovich, K. E. 2004. The Robot’s Rebellion: Finding Meaning in the Age of Darwin. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Sturgeon, N. L. 1986. “What Difference Does It Make Whether Moral Realism Is True?” The Southern Journal of Philosophy, Supplement 24: 115-41.

Sunstein, C. 2005. “Moral Heuristics.” Behavioral and Brain Sciences 28: 531-42.

Swanton, C. 2003. Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Tversky, A., & Kahneman, D. 1981. “The Framing of Decisions and the Psychology of Choice.” Science 211: 453-458.

Vranas, P. B. M. 2005. “The Indeterminacy Paradox: Character Evaluations and Human Psychology.” Noûs 39: 1-42.

Webber, J. 2006. “Virtue, Character and Situation.” Journal of Moral Philosophy 3: 193-213.

Webber, J. 2007. “Character, Common-Sense, and Expertise.” Ethical Theory and Moral Practice 10: 89-104.

Webber, J. 2007a. “Character, Global and Local.” Utilitas 19: 430-434.

Weinberg, N., Nichols, S., & Stich, S. 2001. “Normativity and Epistemic Intuitions.” Philosophical Topics 29: 429-460.

Wright, R. 1995. The Moral Animal: Why We Are the Way We Are: The New Science of Evolutionary Psychology. New York: Vintage.

1 As in Doris (1998, 2002, 2005, 2006), Doris and Stich (2005, 2006), Flanagan (1991: 281), Harman (1999, 2000), Merritt (2000; Meritt, Doris, and Harman forthcoming), and Vranas (2005).

2 As in Adams (2006: Chs. 8-12), Annas (2005), Arpaly (2005), Kamtekar (2004), Kupperman (2001), Miller (2003), Montmarquet (2003), Solomon (2003, 2005), Swanton (2003: 30-1), and Webber (2006, 2007, 2007a).

3 For arguments to the effect that the prospects of reconciliation in the religion/evolution case are doubtful, see Stanovich (2004: 3-28)

4 Distortions made despite expositions of situationism containing explicit assertions to the contrary (Doris 2002: 25, 62-6; 2005: 667).

5 Appiah here endorses Harman’s (1999) suggestion that our ethical energies be directed less to moral education and character building and more to the design of humane institutions — a typical situationist prescription (71).

6 For helpful discussion of the psychological and philosophical complexities attending eliminativism and alternatives, see Kelly et al. (forthcoming).

7 Racial discourse has been repeatedly appropriated for pernicious political ends, as it has by the American right (see MacLean 2007, 2009). This may seem to indicate that eliminativism about race faces more entrenched obstacles than eliminativism about character. It is perhaps worth noting that dubious political appropriations of character are not unheard of, but we suspect that philosophical virtue ethicists intend to distance themselves from such associations.

8 It might be argued, in a broadly Gricean fashion, that such qualifications are already present in character talk. However, the evidence for this conjecture is doubtful (Doris 2002: 97-100)

9 Following Weinberg and colleagues’ (2001) understanding of intuitions.

10 For empirically motivated critiques of intuition, see Horowitz (1998); Doris and Stich (2005); Sinnott-Armstrong (2005, 2007); Sunstein (2005).

11 Elsewhere, Knobe (Doris, Knobe and Woolfolk 2007) entertains the suggestion that such seemingly inconsistent variations in responsibility attribution may sometimes be morally justified.

12 Appiah suggests that this squeamishness may be an evolved tendency, but given the pervasiveness of violence in the anthropological record, we’re not so sure (96).

13 For such a related suggestion regarding atrocity in warfare, see Doris and Murphy (2007). Of course, there may exist both theoretical and practical distance between criminal liability and moral responsibility.

14 MacIntyre (2007) is a philosopher especially alive to this sort of observation.

15 Obviously, there are large issues here; for a case against nativism about morality, see Prinz (2008; 2007: chap. 7).

16 It is surprisingly difficult to make this appealing thought precise, particularly without a good deal of hard work on how “psychologically possible” should be construed (see Doris 2002: 207n17).

17 Authors listed alphabetically. Thanks to Gilbert Harman, Shaun Nichols, and Simine Vazire for valuable comments on earlier drafts.