Explaining Altruism: A Simulation-Based Approach and its Limits

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Eckhart Arnold, Explaining Altruism: A Simulation-Based Approach and its Limits, Ontos, 2008, 310pp., $134.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380071.

Reviewed by Kevin J.S. Zollman, Carnegie Mellon University


With the rapidly growing interest in computer simulations as a scientific tool, many complex methodological and philosophical issues have begun to arise. As with many fledgling scientific practices, it is not always clear what the goals, standards, and exemplary success of this methodology are. Eckhart Arnold's Explaining Altruism: A Simulation-Based Approach and its Limits is an attempt to address these issues, focusing especially on one of the most famous foci for this methodology: the analysis of the evolution of altruism. This book deals with a complex, difficult, and interesting set of issues, but it is ultimately unsuccessful at providing convincing arguments for its admittedly strong claims.

Arnold begins Chapter 1 with an introduction to the issues of interest. He describes the problem of altruism both from a biological and a social perspective and describes briefly the recent explosion of simulation based attempts to tackle this problem. No sooner than he mentions this, he declares these simulations are "typically not of great scientific relevance" (12) -- a bold claim about a currently vibrant and ongoing research program. He briefly outlines a set of requirements which must be satisfied in order for simulations to be relevant, and then claims that few simulations satisfy these constraints.

Chapter 2 provides a detailed description of the puzzle of altruism in human and non-human animal groups. This chapter is followed by a description of "the generalized theory of evolution" in Chapter 3. In addition to describing the central components of biological evolution by natural selection, he describes various mechanisms for "cultural evolution." Arnold correctly notes that a single simulation may have applications in both biological and sociological contexts, and he discusses some of the assumptions underlying this broad applicability.

Chapter 4 represents the beginning of the central argument in the book. Here Arnold presents a simulation model for the evolution of reciprocal altruism (one of the most widely discussed types of altruism). He then provides a detailed description of a variety of results. The careful discussion of his model in this chapter and the appendix represents a significant portion of the book -- over 100 pages. This level of detail might strike the reader as a bit odd, since ultimately he concludes that these types of simulations "provide more of an obstacle than an inspiration to the research on altruism" (73). The central argument for this conclusion is delayed until Chapter 6. He concludes Chapter 4 with a brief discussion of two other mechanisms for the evolution of altruism, kin selection and group selection.

Chapter 4 is meant to be contrasted against the "empirical" methodology for investigating the evolution of altruism which is presented in the next chapter. Arnold begins Chapter 5 by discussing the empirical methodology in biology. He aims to show two conclusions (147-8). First, simulation models have not been empirically validated, and second, simulation models have provided little inspiration to empirical research. Regarding the first goal, validation (for Arnold) appears to require direct quantitative measurement of the parameters of the model; such validation is unlikely since measuring fitness is understandably a difficult task. The second claim relies primarily on a survey published some years ago (Dugatkin 1997), and he only adds one case considered since then.

In the second part of Chapter 5, he turns to altruism in the social sciences. He does not attempt to survey the voluminous literature here. While this is understandable given the literature's size, it is hard to support the claim that simulations have contributed little to empirical science without such a survey. In fact, simulations have inspired at least some laboratory experiments in this field.[1] Apparently recognizing this problem for his central argument, Arnold raises some concerns about the appropriateness of laboratory investigations of behavior for understanding non-laboratory behavior. This is a large issue which is not treated in depth by Arnold, and space prevents me from discussing it here. He ends this chapter by discussing the application of simulation studies to observational studies of human behavior, concluding that it has been of little use.

In the penultimate chapter, Arnold attempts to diagnose what he perceives as the success of the empirical approach and the failure of the simulation approach. He lays out a set of criteria for success of simulations, which will be discussed shortly. Chapter 6 concludes with a brief discussion of the central arguments.

Arnold lays out four potential uses for simulations: (1) they may be used to demonstrate the possibility of some hypothesis, (2) they may be used to explore the set of potential causes to determine what might be a genuine cause, (3) they may be used to predict, and (4) they may be used to explain some phenomenon.[2] The last, he claims, is the highest goal that simulation studies can achieve, but they have failed to achieve it because they do not meet his list of requirements.

There is an odd gap here between the strong rhetoric with which the book is laced and this final claim. While Arnold often declares that simulations have "failed" or are "not of great scientific relevance," it is because they fail to satisfy this highest goal. Even if he is right, a question I will address momentarily, failing to live up to the highest goal possible is hardly a failure.

Simulators often regard their simulations as contributing to the first two goals, either proof of possibility or exploration of the possible causes. Arnold offers little criticism of simulations viewed in this way, except to dismiss many of them as "trivial." He offers little justification for this judgment of triviality, and it is remarkable that he should be eager to dismiss well regarded works so flippantly.

Let us now turn to the question of whether simulations can provide genuine explanations for the evolution of altruism. I see two lines of argument here. First, Arnold claims that simulation studies of altruism have been of little use to empirical studies of animals or humans. Second, Arnold sets out three criteria which any explanatory simulation must satisfy and goes onto claim that most (or all) simulation studies of altruism fail to meet these criteria.

First, let us consider the claim that simulation studies have been useless for empirical research into the study of animal and human behavior. I have already suggested that Arnold does not present a compelling argument for this claim. Even if the reader is convinced that simulations have not been used by empirical researchers, it should be noted that the failure of scholars to use these studies hardly constitutes evidence that they are useless, but this absence could be the result of sociological or psychological barriers to their application. Arnold acknowledges this possibility, but counters that his criteria demonstrate why such applications are unlikely. In this respect, his central argument turns on these requirements, to which we now turn. They are:

Adequacy - "All known causally relevant factors of the modeled empirical process must be represented in the computer simulation." (196)

Robustness - "the simulation results must be stable within the range of accuracy of measurement." (197)

Non-triviality - "the results should not already be deducible without any model or simulation from the empirical description of the process." (197)

Arnold believes that contemporary simulation studies of altruism fail all three criteria.

Regarding the first, adequacy, I believe there is no dispute that most (or all?) simulations fail to capture all relevant causal factors for the evolution of altruism. In fact, this is precisely the point of simulation studies (and idealization in models in general) -- they allow for a careful study of the particular influence of a few factors by studying them in isolation from the others.

Not only do all simulation studies fail to meet this requirement, but all sciences are replete with idealized explanations which would fail Arnold's adequacy requirement. The use of frictionless planes, point masses, and continuous fluid models in physics all explicitly leave out causally relevant features of the systems they attempt to explain. Similarly, the use of randomly mixing populations, unchanging environmental pressures, and no-mutation models in evolutionary biology leave out relevant causal factors. It seems inappropriate to hold simulations to a higher standard than mathematical models in other fields, especially because the distinction between simulation and mathematical models can sometimes be a blurry one.

Instead simulations are used to capture a few important mechanisms, and the simulation study explains by illustrating how that mechanism could have contributed to the outcome we observe. In this way simulations evaluate the efficacy of hypothesized mechanisms and assist in the discovery of new ones. I was surprised that Arnold did not address the now growing philosophical literature about idealization and modeling in science, as these issues have been debated now for some time.

Turning now to the robustness requirement, Arnold claims that there is no general lesson which can be drawn from the study of these simulations, but rather the literature is plagued by inconsistent results. His survey of the literature is not extensive, and I will simply point readers to an attempt by Brian Skyrms to draw a general lesson from this work (Skyrms 1994).

Even if Arnold is right that there are few robust results, it is not clear to me that failures of robustness of this sort demonstrate a methodological failure. We need not look far in human or animal interaction to find places where altruism has failed to evolve. Driving through almost any city during rush hour will provide any skeptic with ample evidence of this claim. Should our simulations say that altruism was likely to evolve in almost any context, this would provide us good reason to doubt the veracity of these results. Instead, the lack of robustness may illustrate the actual difficulty in securing altruism that is present in the natural world.

Finally let us turn to the non-triviality requirement. On its face this requirement is so minimal as to not warrant discussion. It is surprising, however, how much work Arnold believes can be dismissed as trivial. It is clear from the list of works that this is a stronger requirement than it appears, but because he does not give much detail about what counts as trivial, little can be said in response.

Overall, Arnold's book deals with central and important problems in the use of simulations (and models in general) when looking at populations that are difficult to study directly. However, the work is hampered by its attempt at generality, and the reader is often left without convincing argument for the strong claims it presents.


Dugatkin, Lee Alan (1997) Cooperation among Animals: An Evolutionary Perspective. Oxford University Press.

Epstein, Joshua (2008) "Why model?" Santa Fe Institute No. 2008-09-040.

Seinen, Ingrid, and Schram, Arthur (2006) "Social Status and Group Norms: Indirect Reciprocity in a Helping Experiment," European Economic Review 50(3), 581-602.

Skyrms, Brian (1994) "Darwin meets The Logic of Decision: Correlation in Evolutionary Game Theory," Philosophy of Science 61(4): 503-528.

Wedekind, Claus, and Milinski, Manfred (2000) "Cooperation Through Image Scoring in Humans," Science 288, 850-852.

[1]For two examples, Wedekind and Milinki (2000) and Seinen and Schram (2006) both cite simulations studies of altruism as inspiration for their laboratory investigations.

[2]This is perhaps not an exhaustive list. A prominent simulator, Joshua Epstein, details a large list of potential uses of simulations not considered by Arnold (see Epstein 2008).