Explaining Cancer: Finding Order in Disorder

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Anya Plutynski, Explaining Cancer: Finding Order in Disorder, Oxford University Press, 2018, 266pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199967452.

Reviewed by Marta Bertolaso, University Campus Bio-Medico of Rome


Anya Plutynski has written on many topics, and has worked particularly on analyzing modeling across experimentation and theorizing in fields such as population genetics and ecology. For several years now, she has been concentrating on cancer biology, taking medical classes, delving into the scientific literature on cancer research, and trying to "find order in disorder". Her latest book promises to crown years of devoted research in the field.

The wild heterogeneity of cancer (both inter- and intra-tumor kinds) raises doubts that "cancer" could be an umbrella word including "many diseases" and a "heterogeneous kludge of many different diseases" (p. 5). Chapter 1 examines the many "natural ways" of taxonomizing and classifying cancer, each serving a particular perspective and explanatory goal. Plutynski argues that adopting a particular perspective on cancer -- e.g., considering it as a homeostatic property cluster (HPC) -- is both wrong and unproductive. Completely giving up the idea of the unity of cancer, however, is not desirable, since it would annihilate scientists' and clinicians' explanatory and predictive possibilities. Through a discussion of the nature and purpose of classification in science, Plutynski comes up with a fairly "puralistic and pragmatic" (p. 11) conclusion: not only are criteria for classification always domain-specific in science, but classification itself consists of heterogeneous cognitive operations from which scientists consciously pick and choose according to their goals. In fact, there are many natural ways of classifying cancer (e.g., solid or hematologic, sporadic or familial, by stage and grade, by anatomic site, or by genetic mutations), yet "taxonomic pluralism is not in tension with modest realism" (p. 20) as all classifications in fact "track natural facts" even when they cross-cut each other in complex ways.

Chapter 2 shows that "defining 'disease' is not merely a matter of conceptual analysis" (p. 67). Early diagnosis is subject to epistemic (or inductive) risk, but also to evaluative factors (e.g., personal values and desires). Large scale examples (e.g., how the U.S. approached prostate cancer in the 1980s) provide evidence for the degree of uncertainty (both retrospective and prospective), and show the measure of overdiagnosis and overtreatment. Plutynski's epistemological analysis brings into sharp light the importance of values in both policy-setting (e.g., screening or not?) and clinical choices (e.g., when is preventive intervention appropriate?). Screening, for example, is 'imbued' with risk aversion and economic aspects, on a background of problematic evidence for effectiveness.

What Plutynski tries to do in Chapter 2 is to spell out the various factors and make transparent their input into judgement and decision making. So, many definitional criteria involve matters of degree. Defining "dysfunction" turns out to be much more complicated than it might intuitively seem. Different views of "function" -- such as the famous Wright vs. Cummins (etiological vs. functionalist) views of function -- have been used, but no one has found a way to overcome underdetermination problems in actual research. Other problems are raised by Boorse's "biostatistical" theory of disease, because statistical averages in a population do not determine the norm. And the eliminativist view gives up talking about "function" and "dysfunction" altogether, resorting to stating descriptions plus normative judgments. All in all, function and dysfunction, health and disease, norm and abnormality seem to rest upon assumptions regarding the goals of human life, especially because, when it comes to cure and prevention, risk (i.e., a human-related factor) frames disease. The "line drawing problem" is thus an essentially human problem.

Chapter 3 explores and criticizes "causal specificity" and "causal selection", especially with regard to genes and genetic mutations. The mechanistic research program (including its recent shift to systems-level and network approaches) has been successful in identifying alterations to pathways, yet actual research has had to resort to "causal tendencies" more often than "actual causes". What does this mean? In fact,

In science, it is often necessary to give causal 'sketches' or shorthand characterizations of enormously complex and context-sensitive causal pathways, either for pedagogical purposes or for ease of communication. Unfortunately, philosophers entering into such conversations sometimes call upon ideals of evidential reasoning that may be impossible to meet in practice or inappropriate for the purposes of inquiry. (p. 95)

Genes do play a causal role in cancer, but the question is: what can we make of claims that cancer is a "genetic" or "genomic" disease? In fact, identified genes are causally specific (they play a causal role in the progession of cancer), but in a radically context-dependent way, for example, according to epigenetic alterations, the tissue microenvironment, and dynamic interactions with tissue architecture. As Plutynski says, "Features of cancer cells are only one part of the complex process yielding cancer. That is, cancer . . . is a process of production of locally activated dispositions of cells and tissues, dispositions that are highly sensitive to context and subject to interactive effects" (p. 103). The penetrance of cancer-related genetic variants follows something like a power law: there are incredibly many variants that are feebly related to cancer onset, while variants with high penetrance are extremely rare. So "the bar for causal relevance is low: almost everything is 'genetic' (or environmental for that matter)" (p. 114). But beyond probabilistic claims, one factor can be a cause in many different ways (i.e., with many different roles), so the causal selection problem is actually many problems.

Chapter 4 analyzes the complex issue of cause-seeking in epidemology. After an informative overview of how evidence plays out in epidemiology (spelling out different kinds of studies and fallacies, models of evidence such as the statistical approach, and models of inference such as Inference to the Best Explanation (IBE)) in historical perspective as well (calling into play the professionalization of epidemiology), Chapter 4 defends Austin Bradford Hill's (1965) plea for balanced consideration of total available evidence. And the criteria for weighting evidence are many: strength of association, consistency across different backgrounds, specificity of causal role, temporal priority, dosage effects, and plausibility of underlying biological relationship. Plutynski agrees with Hill that the best inference is the one that draws upon the widest array of independent evidence. Two different and enlightening cases occupy center stage in the chapter. The first is the story of the assessment of the causal role of tobacco smoking in lung cancer. The different paths followed in the USA and in the UK clearly demonstrate the role of social, political and economic factors in weighting evidence and taking decisions. The second case analyzes the story of Utah's Downwinders, people living in proximity of nuclear tests. The decision to compensate the Downwinders was supported by an IBE, but it was also (inevitably) political, since for several reasons "we are all Downwinders. Or, more precisely, all US children born in 1951 or shortly thereafter who consumed milk, especially from backyard cows, are Downwinders" (p. 154). There are legally established eligibility criteria for compensation, and these interact with the reasons why wind-carried dust should be considered as a cause of (a higher probability of) leukemia in those populations.

Chapter 5 explores various connections between cancer research and evolutionary theory and models. As Plutynski states in the introduction, "Cancer is like a car breaking down, at least in some respects, but significantly unlike a car breaking down in others. The differences are illuminating; they tell us something important about organisms and how they fail" (p. 3): organisms have phylogeny and ontogeny, they shape their own development and maintenance. Vulnerability to cancer is shaped by the very nature of the biological process(es) that the organism is. Plants, whose cells are much less plastic than animals', are not vulnerable to cancer in the same way. So it is evident that evolution will be relevant in any understanding and explanation of cancer. However, "Roughly three overlapping research programs provide evolutionary perspectives on cancer: evolutionary medicine, evolutionary dynamics, and evolutionary developmental biology" (p. 160). Natural selection certainly has a role to play, since cancer clearly bears some similarity to a product of 'design without a designer'. But "strategic descriptions" of cancer can be strongly misleading, just as similar descriptions are misleading in evolutionary biology. Is cancer a failure ("breakdown" picture) or a success (of intra-organism natural selection)? In reviewing evolutionary explanations in cancer research, Plutynski points to a multilevel perspective, going from proximate to ultimate processes (to use Ernst Mayr's distinction) and spanning the different scales of the organism's life. As for evolutionary dynamics, Plutynski harks back to some of her early works and emphasizes the "how possibly" and "a priori" causal modeling roles of evolutionary dynamic models.

Chapter 6 argues that cancer research is problem (or puzzle) driven rather than theory driven, and endorses the philosophical idea of a "research program" within which to frame the role of theory. Two puzzles are presented in particular: why does cancer incidence increase as we age, and why don't we get cancer more often? Questions are de-composed into more specific questions, and assumptions are made explicit. While the first puzzle drives and sustains the "multistage theory" and the study of cancer-related genetic mutations, the second leads to environmental and systemic regulatory aspects of cancer. The story is told of how researchers approached the puzzles, continually creating the conditions for further research paths. Plutynski relies on these and other historical examples as a basis for meta-reflection on the characteristics of 'good puzzles' and on scientific explanation. On p. 210 we find a good summary of her view:

Scientific explanations are often partial or merely "plausible" . . . In scientific practice explaining is a process that involves shifting back and forth between different characterizations of the problem to be solved, iterations of more or less adequate solutions, and temporary periods of agreement on a general story, followed by arguments for why this general account doesn't fit the facts. These arguments are then overturned, deepened or expanded upon by the next generation of scientists.

Throughout the years and crossing several fields (from population genetics to biomedicine) Plutynski has been elaborating her view of explanations in science as strategic, model-based and mechanism-based constructions, embedded in the human, collective context of living scientists. Such a context, when it comes to cancer, is more and more multidisciplinary and varied. And I agree with Plutynski that this is a field in which philosophers of science will inevitably -- and increasingly -- remain engaged for a long time to come.

Overall, I find the book to be rich and nicely written. The bibliography includes primary research articles, philosophy of biology and philosophy of science classics (dealing with the specific philosophical problems raised throughout the book), theoretical biology, and history of biology.

"What I have done", Plutynski writes, "is to tie my initially naive questions about cancer to broader questions in philosophy of science, in service of starting a conversation among philosophers of science, scientists, and science studies scholars, more generally" (11). The goal is certainly achieved in the best possible way. So let the conversation begin! I hope to contribute by offering three extemporary reflections; debating them fully would (and will) require deepening the several philosophical approaches reviewed in her book.

At times, Plutynski delves into a detailed exploration of alternatives whose interest is not so apparent and convincing if one looks at the ground she covers in the book. For example, the interest of debating the existence of something like the "cancer cell kind" is not so evident in the light of cancer as an evolutionary, multi-level and multi-causal process, as it becomes clear throughout the volume. Indeed, why should cancer research strive to imitate the epistemological features of fundamental chemistry, with a univocal table classifying atoms as being one or the other element? After all, we don't have that for bronchitis, why should we for cancer? Clinical practice is a conjugation, a consilience among different evaluations, but defining 'cancer' or 'the cancer cell' as a biological kind doesn't seem to be among the most useful contributions to that. So perhaps the advice for the reader could be: have a cursory read of the whole volume, then decide which parts are more valuable for deepening your particular point of view.

A second point I would make concerns the importance assigned to 'puzzles' or 'problems' as drivers in cancer research. Several times, Plutynski emphasizes that explanations are interest-dependent: researchers choose questions, explanations, relevant causes according to their interests. It seems to me that this perspective could be less than appropriate in accounting for the scientific community. Reading Chapter 6 and thinking about cancer research history, I wondered whether cancer research development over time would be better understood as being driven by examples (close to Kuhnian paradigms) and experimental apparatuses (as in model-based science) which, once introduced, are then exploited again and again to produce all the possible knowledge from them. This would also better explain the incidence of the "bandwagon effect" described by Plutynski on p. 35 (but see also Robert A.Weinberg 2014). The concept of 'interest-driven' might be more appropriate to account for the clinical context and public health policy, where communities and actors with 'political' and 'pragmatic' goals are found. Yet, I think a pragmatic approach should mandatorily be more complex and encompass all dimensions of science as a human practice in a broader context. Real pragmatics, I think, is found in Chapter 4, in the analysis of real historical cases. I find extremely interesting Plutynski's remark on the possible pragmatic role of mechanistic demands on scientific knowledge: demanding evidence for "mechanism" can be dangerous in that it would leave skeptics a possibility of endless contestation of evidence. The demand for evidence has an ineluctable political dimension:

different contexts might reasonably require different standards, exactly because we may have good reason to act, even before we have anything like a 'full' accounting of the mechanisms in operation . . . [conversely] sometimes we want to await a full accounting, exactly because action will be so very costly.

It is this "sometimes" that puts strong limits on a purely conceptual epistemology and, on the other hand, asks for a more organic philosophical approach to cancer research. If "inference in the context of public health is an iterated, multidisciplinary enterprise and should not be left to judges or juries to assess"; if "how 'deep' and how 'wide' the evidence ought to be . . . [depends] on how evidence is used" (p. 130). And if quality standards on evidence are updated on a regular basis, then not only values and behaviors must be included in our view of science; we should also have a more organic view of science (and cancer research in particular) as a collective, cumulative (albeit plural and not monistic) enterprise.

Finally, I cannot refrain from commenting on the importance of understanding -- not only explaining -- in cancer. In cancer research -- as it develops through time -- I see clear signs of long-term progressive collective orientation along with the proliferation of explanatory models: cancer is no longer seen as a gene based disease but rather as a disease in which the environment plays an important role; system level and systems biology approaches are spreading; cancer is described as a process (continuum dimension) and a thing (discrete dimension), but its processual dynamic is clearly taking over the explanatory challenge posed by carcinogenesis and cancer onset too. Empirical evidence and trends in the explanatory models point towards the peculiar dynamics that structure the organismic developmental process and organogenesis that actually get compromised in cancer. Eventually, cancer is beginning to be understood as a condition of imbalance among the processes that constitute the multicellular living being. It is in this light that we should see cancer as a disease of the body, not of cells. Interesting hints to this perspective appear here and there in Plutynski's book. It is stimulating, for example, to think that "cells in the heart and lungs assist in providing a blood supply to a tumor" (p. 46), and that "most cells taken from tumor biopsies lack the special features typical of cancer cell lines" (p. 47).

Plutynski says that "some mutations are said to 'promote' cancer; some might be better said to 'allow' cancer" (p. 99). But perhaps allowing for cancer is the way a mutation can be a cause of cancer. From what we know of multicellular living beings, cancer is perhaps to be expected as a likely event; and maybe it is much more difficult to explain how multicellular organisms manage to persist and keep their parts in good order. So does cancer really need a scientific explanation? Certainly explanations are possible in cancer research (as they are in research on development or aging), and Plutynski's book is a formidable guide for navigating this area in a more philosophically-informed and conscious way. But explananda are potentially infinite in cancer research; the risk scientists run is that they lose the explanandum while they propose the various explanantia in a non-epistemologically aware fashion. Perhaps understanding cancer will be an equally or more fundamental task than explaining it. A greater understanding, and a greater confidence in choosing explananda and explanantia, is a collective effort for our societies.