Explaining Evil: Four Views

Placeholder book cover

W. Paul Franks (ed.), Explaining Evil: Four Views, Bloomsbury, 2019, 180pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781501331121.

Reviewed by Matthew K. Douglass, Ouachita Baptist University


When confronted with the reality of widespread and terrible suffering, we naturally seek an explanation for why such things happen. In their attempts to make sense of suffering, philosophers have settled on a handful of ways to discuss the problem, dividing it up into smaller, more manageable pieces. It is common, for instance, to distinguish suffering caused by human cruelty from suffering that follows from indifferent laws of nature. Some philosophers address specific instances of suffering that are so horrific or seemingly pointless that they defy explanation, while others focus on why there is so much suffering in the world and why it is unfairly distributed. However, the problem of evil is parsed, it is typically stated as a problem for theism. If God is all-powerful, all-knowing, and morally perfect, he must have the inclination and ability to eliminate evil. Why, then, does evil exist?

As valuable as such discussions are, framing the issue as a problem for theism can hide the fact that evil is a problem for everyone, theist and atheist alike. As W. Paul Franks notes in the introductory chapter, "the task of explaining evil is not something that falls to theists alone . . . Non-theists are just as prone to seek out explanations" (2). And because the problem of evil is often stated as an argument against theism, discussions can focus too narrowly on whether this theodicy or that objection to theism is successful. However, Franks continues, "while this is a worthwhile activity, taken alone it doesn't actually give us what we were initially looking for -- an explanation for evil" (2).

The central purpose of the book, therefore, is to keep the bigger question in mind and to find a satisfactory explanation for evil. Toward that end, the book presents four competing explanations for evil. Each chapter begins with a leading essay that presents and defends an account for why evil exists, followed by responses from the other three contributors, and finishing with a reply from the original author. The first two chapters deal with theistic accounts from Richard Brian Davis and Paul Helm, while the final two chapters present the views of atheists Michael Ruse and Erik J. Wielenberg.

It is worth commenting on the scope of the book before I summarize each chapter. In order to explain evil, it is first necessary to at least roughly define what evil is. All four authors, it turns out, conceive of evil in moral terms, and thus "natural evils" like earthquakes, disease, and famine are mostly left out of the discussion. In the introduction, Franks says that separating the problem of moral evil from nature-based suffering helps us see that a solution to one problem may not have anything to do with the other. Moreover, he claims, separating the problems encourages non-theists, who may not think that nature-based suffering poses any philosophical problem, to nevertheless engage with the problem of evil (6). To be sure, there are benefits to focusing on moral evils alone. However, an overwhelming amount of suffering results from the indifferent forces of nature, and even if it poses no special problem for an atheist, it is an acute problem for theists. Thus, even if nature-based suffering does not properly count as evil, it still would have been good for the theists (at least) to discuss the problem more. Having said that, let me turn to the substance of each chapter.

In Chapter 1, Davis explains evil from the perspective of "agent-causal theism." According to this view, evil exists because humans were endowed by God with the power of self-motion, "of initiating volitions to act . . . in light of the reasons [they] have for acting" (14). After briefly giving reasons to think that humans have agent-causal powers, Davis devotes most of his essay to the claim that only agent-causal theism can successfully explain the reality of evil. As Davis describes it, evil essentially involves immoral thoughts, actions, and decisions freely chosen by a conscious moral agent. But free will, he argues, is an illusion if every choice has been predetermined by a series of prior external causes. Consequently, deterministic worldviews -- in particular Darwinian Naturalism and Calvinistic Theism -- will be unable to account for the sort of freedom that makes evil possible. Moreover, he argues, Darwinian Naturalism cannot explain the existence of conscious beings, since there is no way for purely physical causes to produce consciousness. Ultimately, Davis concludes, evil is possible only if theism is true. Thus, ironically, the reality of evil is proof of God's existence.

In Chapter 2, Helm defends Theistic Compatibilism; however, he is careful to note, his compatibilism is not essential to his explanation of evil. Instead, Helm focuses on two distinct questions. First, what is God's purpose for ordaining/permitting evil? Second, granted that God ordains evil, how does it occur? Helm answers the first question by considering God's purpose in creating the world. According to Helm, God creates in order to express his glory, power, goodness, and perfection. Following Alvin Plantinga's felix culpa theodicy, Helm suggests that a world in which God becomes incarnate, atones for sin, and defeats evil is incommensurably better than a world without evil. To explain how evil comes about, Helm interprets "the Fall" story in Genesis as an historical account. On this reading, humanity was originally given a good, but mutable character. Unfortunately -- for reasons that we can never fully understand -- the original humans rebelled against God and now all humanity is bound to sin. Evil, therefore, is the product of this sinful nature, though importantly, God will eventually restore and glorify the original creation. Helm's approach in this chapter follows the scholastic tradition of "faith seeking understanding." For him, philosophy is useful in this search for understanding, but ultimately it is limited; since we are inquiring into the inscrutable will of God, questions will inevitably arise that human reason cannot answer. Similarly, while Helm values the natural sciences, he argues that when science conflicts with faith, faith should take priority: "The important thing is that science is provisional, revelation is not" (61).

Next, the book switches to two atheistic accounts of evil. In Chapter 3, Ruse defends his opening claim that "I believe in the existence of evil" (83), while at the same time rejecting objective morality. An evil action, on his view, is one that goes against the general moral sentiments ingrained in us through evolution. In complex organisms, especially those who live in large social groups, genetically-determined patterns of behavior arise in order to promote the long-term survival of a species. In humans, the sense of right and wrong arose as both a shortcut mechanism for making complex decisions in a social context, as well as a motivator to cooperate despite the inclination to cheat and steal whenever possible. Importantly, on Ruse's account morality depends on human nature and is thus universal, not relative among people or cultures. Thus, evil exists because it is a violation of the natural. "I think Himmler was evil," he writes, "because he consciously of choice went against what it is to be a human being" (101). At the same time, however, morality is contingent since humanity could have evolved differently and some other rules of behavior might have been necessary for long-term survival. Ultimately, then, Ruse affirms the existence and substance of morality, and, in turn, the reality of evil; he simply denies that morality is objective or based on anything non-physical, like Platonic Forms or the divine will.

In the final chapter, Wielenberg explains evil from the perspective of "robust normative realism." On this view, being evil is a non-natural property that cannot be reduced to a natural property (like being painful) or a supernatural property (like being forbidden by God). In addition, Wielenberg affirms the existence of basic ethical facts -- substantive, metaphysically necessary moral truths that are true without explanation or external justification. These facts form the basis of morality and are not based on anything else. One such ethical fact is that it is evil to cause pain just for fun. But what, precisely, is the relationship between the property being an instance of causing pain for fun and the property being evil? According to Wielenberg, there is a robust causal relationship between the two; the first simply and directly causes the next, without any intermediate law of nature. So, on his view, evil exists in our world because certain non-moral properties, like pain and cruelty, exist. As for the prevalence of evil, Wielenberg turns to the specific evil of dehumanization, in which the perpetrator denies the human personhood of his victim. After describing some examples and common features of dehumanization, Wielenberg concludes that "evolutionary forces have shaped our minds so that dehumanization comes easily to us, though the specific nature of dehumanization varies across cultures" (137).

Overall, the book is a welcome addition to the literature on the problem of evil. It approaches the problem in a way that is refreshingly different from the norm. The position-and-response format allows the reader to grasp the key elements of each view, briefly stated and in conversation with each other. Because the position, objections, and replies are collected together, by the end of each chapter it is clear what the lead position is, as well as its strengths and weaknesses.

Unfortunately, to allow for such back-and-forth within a short volume, each essay is condensed and several key assertions are left unsupported. Similarly, the brevity of the volume restricts the interaction among the authors. Each leading essay is subjected to three sets of objections, some of which are significant and would require a full essay to address adequately. This is not to say that the arguments are weak or half-baked; the authors frequently refer to previous works where their views are discussed in more depth, and a helpful list of recommended reading is included as an appendix. And for the most part, the authors do a good job of sketching plausible responses to the various objections, though in some instances, serious objections are dispatched with just a few sentences.

Despite these limitations, the book is engaging and accessible for interested readers. The essays are short and clear, giving enough detail to explain each position without overwhelming the reader. In addition, the book touches on a wide variety of philosophical topics -- the nature of free will, normative ethics and metaethics, possible worlds, epistemology, and philosophy of language. For undergraduate classes, the book would be a good introduction to some of these topics and a useful way to show how they are interrelated.