Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem

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Rodrigo Borges, Claudio de Almeida, and Peter D. Klein (eds.), Explaining Knowledge: New Essays on the Gettier Problem, Oxford, 2017, 414pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724551.

Reviewed by Jonathan Stoltz, University of St. Thomas


It has now been 55 years since Edmund Gettier's three-page article, "Is Justified True Belief Knowledge?", was published in Analysis. It can be argued that no other journal article in philosophy has had a more profound impact on the trajectory of philosophy than Gettier's. The article has been cited in more than 3,600 scholarly works and has spawned a number of new subfields within epistemology. Given this, one shouldn't be surprised to hear that a new book of essays on "the Gettier problem" has been published.

Let me begin by addressing one initial complaint that I can imagine being thrown at this new volume. In a world where several thousand articles already reference Gettier's 1963 paper and many hundreds of articles have already been published on the so-called Gettier problem, is it really necessary to commission and publish a book of new essays on the Gettier problem? If the book is meant to be a testament to the profound impact of Gettier's article, would not an anthology of twenty or twenty-five of the most famous articles already published on the problem have been just as worthy of publication? After all, it is difficult to defend the claim that this new book fills an existing gap in the philosophical literature. So, given that this is a collection of new essays, it is worth asking what this volume is seeking to accomplish -- what its cumulative value is -- and whether the essays deliver on that promise.

The editors' introduction provides a brief sketch of the key features of Gettier cases and walks readers through some of the most familiar lines of response. Little space, however, is devoted to offering a defense of the value of publishing these new essays. Readers are told that, "This is the perfect time to provide the philosophical community with the latest developments in the scholarship on this problem," but we are not told why this is so, or why these "latest developments" should come from new essays as opposed to recently published pieces.

In short, the introduction fails to make a compelling case for the importance of the book. This is not to say, of course, that the volume is a failure. Far from it. The twenty-three chapters are, on the whole, excellent contributions to the field of epistemology and provide a clear picture of the deep and lasting importance of the Gettier problem.

The list of contributing authors is a veritable Who's Who of contemporary epistemology. Some of the contributors -- Keith Lehrer, Alvin Goldman, Peter Klein, Fred Dretske -- were among the first wave of thinkers to publish articles that directly or indirectly responded to the Gettier problem back in the 1960s and early 1970s. But the book also includes many contributions by younger epistemologists who were born one or even two decades after the original publication of Gettier's article. The fact that the volume consists of chapters written by multiple generations of scholars reflects the lasting importance of the Gettier problem to contemporary epistemology. Among those living philosophers who have made the most significant contributions to the Gettier-problem literature, nearly all of them (setting aside Gettier himself) contributed chapters to this book. One notable exception is Timothy Williamson. His views are referenced in twelve of the twenty-three chapters, and in the editors' introduction as well. In many of those chapters Williamson's views are featured prominently. Given this, it is somewhat disappointing that Williamson did not author a chapter of his own. Nevertheless, the complete list of contributors is of the highest quality and the full collection reflects the quality of its contributors.

The essays are grouped under five themes, with four to six chapters treating each theme. The themes are: (I) Solving the Gettier Problem, (II) The Gettier Legacy, (III) Gettier and Philosophical Methodology, (IV) Gettier and Inferential Knowledge, and (V) Dissolving the Gettier Problem. It is not fully clear whether the solicited chapters were pre-assigned to these five themes, or whether the editors grouped articles together only after receiving them. Whatever the case, there are only rare occasions in which the contributors "talk" to one another within a single theme. For example, though six separate essays fall under the Part I theme of "Solving the Gettier Problem," and though the individual essays reach different conclusions about how the problem is to be solved, there are fewer occasions than one might have hoped where one of the authors references the views of other contributors whose proposed solutions to the Gettier problem differ from his or her own.

That this "talk" or "conversation" between chapters does not often occur is, it must be admitted, not particularly surprising or unusual, given the nature of collections of this sort. Yet, it is here where one wishes that the editors would have done more to showcase how each of the individual essays within a single theme fits with the other essays on that theme. It is not uncommon, for example, for edited volumes to include, at the beginning of each thematic group of essays, a short introduction to that theme that both keys readers in to the central topic at issue and walks readers through the relations between the articles in that group. But no such introductions are provided in this book. To express this mild criticism differently, this volume of essays is best construed not as a twenty-three chapter, integrated presentation of the present state of scholarship on the Gettier problem, but rather as a collection of twenty-three independent essays on the Gettier problem. In turn, this volume is more likely to be consulted by students and scholars who are looking for a specific article (capturing so-and-so's current views on the Gettier problem) than it is to be used by those who want to get a comprehensive picture of how the Gettier problem relates to broader issues in epistemology.

Having said all that, it must be emphasized that the individual articles are strong pieces of scholarship. The ten articles on "Solving the Gettier Problem" and "Dissolving the Gettier Problem" are well done, but it is the middle three parts that shine the brightest and give the best evidence of the lasting impact of Gettier's 1963 essay on current disputes. In particular, the essays on the themes of "Gettier and Philosophical Methodology" and "Gettier and Inferential Knowledge" constitute the most important contributions. The essays on the former theme grapple with two overlapping issues that have come to the fore in philosophy in recent years, and that are especially relevant to epistemology and the Gettier problem more specifically: the role of "intuition" in philosophical theorizing and the debate between "armchair" philosophy and experimental philosophy (X-Phi). Though the X-Phi movement and the recent disputes over appeals to intuitions in philosophy extend far beyond epistemology, the Gettier problem is one specific domain of inquiry where an examination of the value of intuitions (whether by philosophers or by "lay-persons") is of particular importance. The essays in this portion of the book are all on roughly the same side of the debate over the role of intuitions in philosophy, and (in very different ways) show how the Gettier problem can be used to support a productive role for intuitions in philosophy.

The essays on "Gettier and Inferential Knowledge" focus on specific principles of deductive closure and "counter-closure" in epistemology. In particular, most of the essays address some version of the thesis that, in cases of inferential reasoning, we can gain knowledge of a proposition q only if we have knowledge of the proposition p that was essential to our deductive inference from p to q. This principle of counter-closure is succinctly expressed by Branden Fitelson as (p. 313):

Counter-Closure (CC). If S competently deduces Q from her belief that P, (thereby) coming to know Q (via deductive inference), then S knew that P (and she maintained her knowledge of P throughout the inference.

Fitelson and the other contributors on this theme take up the question of whether one can possibly obtain inferential knowledge from a false belief, or whether there must be something along the lines of a "No false lemmas" constraint (or an even stronger constraint) on inferential knowledge. These chapters (both individually and in concert) serve to provide helpful syntheses of the growing literature over the past fifteen years that has argued against some version of counter-closure.

It would be neither possible nor worthwhile to discuss each and every one of the essays. As has been said, overall, the essays are very well done. To be sure, some chapters are more convincingly argued than others. Some chapters are better/more clearly written than others. Some chapters are much more squarely connected to the Gettier problem than others. But, on the whole, the essays in this book are of high quality and do serve to advance scholarship. What I shall do in the remainder of this review is zoom in on one question related to the Gettier problem and discuss how that question plays out in several of the essays.

The question to be addressed is this: What is a "Gettier case" and how should we demarcate what does and does not count as a "Gettier case"?

This may seem like a silly question on which to focus. After all, one thing that is abundantly clear from this new book is that Gettier's 1963 article has already had a lasting impact on many issues in contemporary epistemology, and the fruitfulness of Gettier's original article doesn't necessarily depend on philosophers having the "correct" understanding of what a Gettier case is. In an important sense, the value of Gettier's article is directly seen through its influence over the past fifty-five years, and this effect would not be diminished were we to discover that there is no philosophical consensus on what the Gettier problem actually is or on what counts as a Gettier case.

On the other hand, a substantial number of recent articles focus on identifying "the moral of the Gettier problem." But how philosophers understand the moral will depend heavily on how broadly or narrowly they conceive of Gettier cases. In particular, the articles on "Gettier and Philosophical Methodology" seek to draw inferences about the role of intuitions in philosophy. But what inferences can be drawn may very well hinge on how broadly one interprets the scope of Gettier cases. Peter Blouw, Wesley Buckwalter, and John Turri, in "Gettier Cases: A Taxonomy," put forward the provocative claim that we should altogether "abandon the notion of a 'Gettier case'" (p. 251).

I think that this is a mistake, and in the remainder of this review, I will show that Blouw, Buckwalter, and Turri reach their conclusion largely because they adopt such a broad understanding of "Gettier cases" that the whole notion ends up being bereft of philosophical value. Before that argument can be made, allow me, first, to propose five different ways in which one might demarcate the boundaries of Gettier cases (from the narrowest to the broadest readings):

  1. (Gettier-baptized) The class of Gettier cases includes all and only those (two) scenarios that are actually featured in his 1963 article.
  2. (Infer. JTB + A) The class of Gettier cases includes all and only those scenarios in which the subject lacks knowledge even though she forms, via inference (from a justified but false belief), a justified true belief.
  3. (Infer. JTB) The class of Gettier cases includes all and only those scenarios in which the subject lacks knowledge even though she forms, via inference, a justified true belief.
  4. (JTB) The class of Gettier cases includes all and only those scenarios in which the subject lacks knowledge even though she forms a justified true belief.
  5. (TB) The class of Gettier cases includes all and only those scenarios in which the subject lacks knowledge even though she forms a true belief.

This list is, no doubt, incomplete, but will suffice for my purposes.

The narrowest portrayal, (A), restricts the class of Gettier cases to just those two cases that are explicitly offered by Gettier himself and few if any philosophers defend such a narrow reading. The second proposal, (B), is not restricted to the actual scenarios described by Gettier, but it does demand that Gettier cases display the same genetic structure as is found in Gettier's original examples. In particular, Gettier cases must be situations in which the subject ends up with a justified true belief (that, nonetheless, is not knowledge), and in which this belief is reached via an inference from a justified false belief. Philosophers adopting this interpretation are inclined to place important weight on two assumptions -- (a) the fallibility of justification and (b) the closure of justification through known entailments -- both of which are explicitly affirmed by Gettier. Many of the essays appear to adopt an interpretation along the lines of (B), but this is clearest in Rodrigo Borges' "Inferential Knowledge and the Gettier Conjecture," where he repeatedly speaks of "Gettier's blueprint," which involves assumptions (a) and (b) above.

Some philosophers may claim that proposal (B) misses the point of Gettier's original article. Gettier's objective, after all, was to show that the justified true belief analysis of knowledge cannot be correct. Insofar as this is the case, it can be argued that what is truly essential to a Gettier case is not the genetic structure, but only the fact that a person forms a justified true belief but does not possess knowledge. In other words, what matters is not the way in which the belief is formed -- e.g., via inference from a justified false belief -- but only the fact that the relevant belief is justified and true . . . and yet not an instance of knowledge. This way of understanding Gettier cases, (D), can be seen in numerous recent articles. Now, it should be obvious that proposal (D) accepts many scenarios that would not count under proposal (B). In turn, the "moral" of the Gettier problem will likely be interpreted differently by proponents of (D) than it is by proponents of (B).

As I have said, many authors in this volume implicitly support an understanding of Gettier cases that fall along the lines of proposal (B). Those include not just Borges but perhaps also all those thinkers who are primarily concerned with the fallibility of justification, including Peter Klein, Robert Shope, Keith Lehrer, and others. For them, the explanatory value of Gettier cases is tied to the very assumptions that Gettier himself made about the nature of justification -- and, in particular, the key assumption that a justified belief can still be false.

Blouw, Buckwalter, and Turri, by contrast, adopt an interpretation of 'Gettier cases' that is far broader in scope. It is at least as broad as proposal (D), and potentially broader. They include in their taxonomy scenarios that do not involve inferential beliefs at all, and scenarios where the subject may hold no (relevant) false belief. Their interpretation includes as a Gettier case the classical example from Carl Ginet (via Goldman) of papier-mâché facades of red barns -- a scenario that would not be considered a Gettier case at all under proposal (B). Moreover, in their taxonomy, they do not even specify that the beliefs in question are justified. (In none of the examples they provide, nor in any of the five categories of Gettier cases that they propose, do they mention "justification" at all.) In this respect, their understanding of Gettier cases is so broad that it may very well include mere true beliefs (such as in their 'Gettier Category 5').

Given how broadly they interpret the concept of a Gettier case, and given that they don't even refer to the concept of justification when specifying their different categories, it is not at all surprising that they fail to find any predictive or explanatory value in the notion of a Gettier case. It is also not surprising that two of their categories -- 'Gettier Category 1' where there is no relevant false belief at all, and 'Gettier Category 5' where it is far from clear that the subject's belief is even justified -- were not. in experimental tests, judged to be (statistically) significantly different from control cases of knowledge and ignorance. They take all this as evidence that "there is no one thing that counts as a Gettier case" and that "the nominal category 'Gettier case' lacks explanatory value" (p. 251). I, by contrast, take their results as evidence that they have adopted a far too broad understanding of what counts as a 'Gettier case' and have indiscriminately lumped together many kinds of scenarios that should not be considered Gettier cases at all.

Be that as it may, the fact that the parameters of Gettier cases are still up for debate illustrates the importance of philosophers continuing to grapple with, and identify the lessons to be learned from, Gettier's article. But the article's ongoing importance was not really in dispute, as is seen from the diversity and strength of the articles collected together in this new book.