Explaining Norms

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Geoffrey Brennan, Lina Eriksson, Robert E. Goodin and Nicholas Southwood, Explaining Norms, Oxford University Press, 2013, 290pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199654680.

Reviewed by Gerald Gaus, The University of Arizona


One of the most important -- and refreshing -- developments in recent social philosophy has been the emergence of analyses of social and other norms. The study of norms forces us to consider how normativity is intertwined with social facts and psychological attitudes, and how critical normative relations among us depend on historical and cultural contingency. Norms are created, not discovered; as human normative artifacts their study requires the synthesis of philosophical analysis and social science, something at which the philosophers of the Australian National University -- such as Brennan, Eriksson, Goodin and Southwood -- excel.

The authors present their book as "a sourcebook for social scientists and philosophers of social science, offering them the tools they need to fit an account of norms into their own preferred models of social life" (10). In contrast to Cristina Bicchieri's important The Grammar of Society (2006), they do not seek to present an account of just one type of norm (in Bicchieri's case, social norms), but a general analysis of "the concept of a norm as such" (13). With an analysis of the general concept in hand, in Part I of the book the authors distinguish formal norms (such as laws) from informal norms such as social and moral norms.

Part II turns to explaining the emergence and persistence of change of norms. The authors stress rational actor explanations, aiming to show how norms serve the interests of rational agents, and how compliance with norms are equilibrium strategies of rational agents (135). However, they also present "social meaning" analyses, stressing how norms serve as signals and define social roles that shape identities. In contrast, the authors do not seem to care much for social evolutionary explanations. References to evolutionary concepts pop up, and there are some short discussions (147-49; 152-54), but there is no serious attention to the important work of, for example, Robert Boyd and Peter Richerson (1985, 2005a, 2005b) or Herbert Gintis (2009).

Part III turns from explaining norms to using norms in explanations; the authors examine how agents can be guided by norms for both non-instrumental and instrumental reasons, and, interestingly, how norms figure into explanations even when agents breach them. The final chapter is especially innovative and informative, dealing with norms that guide not behavior, but attitudes and deliberation.

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As I mentioned, the authors are concerned with the "concept" of a norm. To identify this concept and so the subject of their study, they employ traditional philosophical analysis:

That is to say, we will be looking for sets of individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions that demarcate the concept of a norm as such, and the more specific concepts of a non-formal (as opposed to a formal) norm and a social (as opposed to a moral) norm in particular. (13)

This method is critical, for early in the book they eliminate competing analyses of norms by developing counterexamples. Consider, for example, an account of norms that has an empirical condition according to which N is a norm in group G only if a significant portion of G acts on N. The authors dismiss such an account by offering a case of the "Moldovans," who all judge that one should not urinate in public pools, know that others share their judgments, disapprove of urinating, feel guilty for doing so, but they all do so anyway, mistakenly thinking that others are complying. Thus they all have empirical expectations that are universally false. On an account that accepts the empirical condition, there would be no anti-urinating norm, but the authors hold that we would say the Moldovans do have a norm, so the empirical condition must be rejected (20-21). In a similar vein, Bicchieri's influential analysis, which involves a desire to follow the norm, is rejected on the basis of other somewhat involved cases, for example one where everyone follows the norm but has a secret desire not to, so they do not really desire to follow it (23-26).

Philosophers are traditionally drawn to searching for necessary and sufficient conditions for the application of terms (and usually the test is whether an analysis conforms to the linguistic intuitions of English speakers). I am skeptical, however, whether this is a fruitful approach in employing concepts in explanatory models; there is no reason to suppose that the precise contours of the way English speakers employ the word "norm" is part of, say, the best explanatory model of norm-guided behavior. After all, we wish our analysis to be elegant, powerful, and to capture a great deal of what we wish to explain; an account that does so is to be valued, even if it misses cases where there is universal error about the behavior of others (as with the Moldovans) or universal secret desires to be norm violators. Let us accept that Bicchieri's model does not perfectly track applications of the term "norm" (or even say, "social norm"). If, as I think recent experimental evidence indicates (Bicchieri and Xiao, 2009; Bicchieri and Chavez, 2010, 2013), it generates surprising hypotheses that are supported by the data, and even grounds interventions in a wide range of cases, then it is a powerful explanatory model of norms, probably just because it forsakes the project of employing a concept of a norm that perfectly tracks our intuitions. Importantly, the authors themselves employ the modeling approach rather than philosophical analysis in their use of the rational actor model in explaining norms. The rational actor model does not track everything that a competent speaker would say about rational action, but it is a simple, and often very enlightening, model of rational action that captures a great deal of the variance.

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Let us put aside worries about method. The authors advance the following analysis of norms:

A normative principle P is a norm within group G if and only if:

(i) A significant proportion of G have P-corresponding normative attitudes; and

(ii) A significant proportion of the members of G know that a significant proportion of the members of G have P-corresponding normative attitudes (29).

Normative principles (P) are general requirements "instantiated" by norms (3); the normative attitudes that correspond to these normative principles are diverse, including normative beliefs, normative expectations, reactive attitudes, dispositions to have such attitudes, or attitudes that entail any of the above. Because the account requires such normative attitudes, the authors stress that this is a "non-reductive" account of norms: norms are not reduced to constellations of desire or social facts, but possess an ineliminable normative element (4).

Given this general analysis, Brennan and his coauthors maintain that "moral norms are clusters of moral judgments. Social norms are clusters of normative attitudes of some others kind -- social judgments, as we might say" (58). Moral norms are in no way grounded in actual or presumed social practices; for N to be a moral norm, in the minds of the participants in G who hold the relevant normative attitudes, the justification of the normative principle P "may not be grounded, even in part, in presumed social practices" (71). In this sense, the authors insist that on purely conceptual grounds, a moral norm must be entirely practice independent in this way. In contrast, social norms instantiate normative principles that, in the minds of the relevant participants, are essentially practice-dependent normative "judgments" (72). Throughout the book the quintessential social norm is the Oxford don's norm of passing the port to the left (59-60); in the minds of the dons, the normative attitudes are grounded (at least partially) in the judgment that this is "the done thing" at Oxford (70).

One of the distinctive features of Brennan and his co-authors' analysis is the claim that the core function of norms in general is

to make us accountable to one another. . . . What accountability involves is others having a recognized right or entitlement to determine how one is to behave. When we become accountable to one another, we effect a normatively significant modification of our relations with each other . . . we are in a position to hold one another to account and to demand and expect things of one another. (36)

Throughout I was not quite clear what element in their general analysis of norms necessarily gives rise to accountability; although some of their set of possible normative attitudes, such as the reactive attitudes, do indeed seem intimately related to accountability and responsibility, others, such as "normative beliefs" are not obviously so related. Even normative "disapproval" is not closely tied to accountability; I normatively disapprove of eating sushi, but I do not hold fans of sushi accountable. I certainly concur, however, that accountability is critical to many types of norms. The authors have done a real service in highlighting it.

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As even this thumbnail sketch indicates, there are a number of moving parts in this analysis of norms: normative principles, normative attitudes (which cannot be reduced to pure empirical claims, including claims about psychological states), grounding relations (which involve justification in a person's mind), accountability, a threshold of the percentage of G who must share normative expectations, and so on. I have tried to follow the analysis carefully, but I am not confident that I have fully grasped the details of each element, and how they are related. Allowing that this is a complicated book and that Brennan and his co-authors no doubt have much more to say on these matters, let me raise some worries, especially about their analysis of moral norms.

Although, as I have said, the authors strive for an analysis of norms that gives the necessary and sufficient condition for N to be a norm, there is one important type of norm that is not discussed in the book, and which clearly does not fit their analysis -- to wit, personal norms. N is a personal norm of Alf's if Alf is committed to following N even if the face of evidence that very few others have either normative or empirical expectation that he will follow N, nor does he expect them to conform to N. Thus N can be a personal norm within group G even though a necessary condition of the authors' analysis is not met, i.e., that "a significant proportion of G have P-corresponding normative attitudes". Indeed, only a very small proportion of the group (at a limit, one person) might hold a personal norm, and yet it is a norm within the group (for those who hold it).

Bicchieri argues that most moral norms are personal norms (2006: 20-21). Shaun Nichols (2010) has suggested that personal norms may be even more important in explaining moral behavior than Bicchieri allows; whereas she thinks that norms of justice are social norms, Nichols raises the possibility that even equal division norms might be personal norms. People might unconditionally hold that, say, in ultimatum games they should favor equal splits even if they do not believe that others favor such splits or will in fact split equally.

So what to do about personal norms? As I see it, the authors could either (a) claim that Bicchieri, Nichols and others are simply not competent users of the concept "norm" -- personal norms are not true moral norms but simply "moral principles" (230n); (b) abandon their proffered analysis, which requires significant sharing of the underlying attitudes; or (c) acknowledge that in Explaining Norms they are modeling a certain interesting class of norms (those that involve widespread shared normative expectations) and forsake the claim to a philosophical analysis of the concept. It is important to stress that option (a) is not simply to reject the force of an unusual "counterexample," but a wholesale dismissal of a type of norm that core investigators have identified as a quintessentially moral norm.

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Let us call the Standard Classification that which models some of morality as unconditional personal norms ("I must oppose and morally condemn slavery even if everyone in my society accepts it!") while other parts of morality are understood as social norms, which bind only if enough others share the normative expectation that an act is required and/or have the empirical expectations that others will conform to the norm ("If enough others acknowledge and respect the rights of property, then there is an obligation in justice to respect property"). Morality qua social norms thus identifies only conditional obligations. Rawls thought conformity to the demands of justice was indeed conditional in this way: "it is rational for each person to act on the principles of justice only on the assumption that for the most part these principles are recognized and similarly acted upon by others" (1999: 382-83). Brennan and his co-authors propose an alternative analysis (let us call it the "ANU View"), according to which there is a distinct class of moral norms, which is to be sharply distinguished from both social norms and, though they do not consider them, by implication personal norms.

It is good to have an alternative clearly put on the table for further discussion. I am not, however, convinced that the ANU View is to be preferred to the Standard Classification. The authors are quite explicit that, if we accept that the ANU View of moral norms, it is irrational for the people who hold the normative attitudes which comprise the moral norm (call them the Norm's Core Group) to actually follow the norm -- to act as the norm requires because the norm requires it (214).

It may be helpful to give an example. Take a moral norm that exists in most societies forbidding rape. Consider, first, what it would take for a Namibian to have the kind of normative attitude that is constitutive of the moral norm in Namibia forbidding rape. [A] To have the kind of normative attitude constitutive of the moral norms in Namibia forbidding rape would require having the judgement that one mustn't rape, where this judgment is not grounded, even in part, in a presumed norm in Namibia forbidding rape. (214)

Now consider what it would take for a Namibian to follow the anti-rape moral norm. [B] To follow the anti-rape norm would require having a non-instrumental desire to act in accordance with the anti-rape norm. This means having a desire to act in accordance with the anti-rape norm such that the justification, in the Namibian's mind, derives from the moral norm . . . that forbids rape, that is, from a particular accepted rule or normative principle. (214)

On the ANU View, this involves an incoherence. Insofar as it is a moral norm, it necessitates basic normative attitudes that must satisfy [A], which require that the judgment be independent of a norm (or a constellation of normative attitudes in a society). But to follow the norm as in [B] requires that one act because a norm requires it. Thus, on the ANU View following a moral norm is incoherent for the Norm's Core Group -- those who actually do hold the normative attitudes on which the norm is based!

This may simply be a case where the ANU's modus ponens is my modus tollens. When one formulates a theory that aims to make sense of moral norms and to show how they enter into social scientific explanations, but then comes to the conclusion that people (who have the requisite normative attitudes) cannot, as a conceptual truth, coherently follow moral norms, I begin to wonder whether the analysis has gone astray. What we might have thought was a social scientific question (do rational people who have the normative attitudes supporting the moral norms follow moral norms?) supposes a conceptual impossibility. This is especially puzzling since the existing Standard View makes this a perfectly sensible topic of inquiry. In these sorts of cases morality is best captured by unconditional personal norms; so we can coherently inquire into the conditions under which people follow the personal norms they affirm.

But on many views, personal norms do not exhaust the story of morality. Even when acting morally you sometimes acts on the grounds that your society has a norm of justice N which, as Rawls said, "for the most part is recognized and similarly acted upon by others." Rawls and Bicchieri, among many others, hold that the norms of justice are often conditional; if others are ignoring the property norm, then it is not true that one should respect the property of others. Thus it makes sense to say that a just person genuinely follows the justice norms of his society. The Standard Classification allows for this because justice norms can also be social norms. Note that the Standard Classification leaves it open how many norms of justice are social norms; it simply allows for the category of moral norm qua social norm. I believe it is a fundamental category, others disagree. A virtue of the Standard Classification is that it makes room for this disagreement. The ANU View, however, once again makes all this a conceptual impossibility. If it is a social norm, it cannot also be a moral norm, and if it is a moral norm it cannot be coherently followed by those who uphold its underlying principles of justice. Perhaps somewhere along the way I have lost my true philosophical instincts, but all this seems needlessly paradoxical.

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Even though I have reservations about their overarching account, there is no doubt that Explaining Norms is the work of a very smart band of philosophers. I have only scratched the surface of their sophisticated analysis. There are insightful discussions throughout, which include nice observations about bad norms, and how we might model internalizing and following norms. It is certainly a significant contribution to the emerging, and important, literature on norms.


Bicchieri, Cristina 2006. The Grammar of Society: The Nature and Dynamics of Norms. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006.

Bicchieri, Cristina and Alex Chavez 2010. "Behaving as Expected: Public Information and Fairness Norms." Journal of Behavioral Decision Making, vol. 23: 161-178.

--- 2013, "Norm Manipulation, Norm Evasion: Experimental Evidence." Economics and Philosophy, vol 29: 175-198.

Bicchieri, Cristina and Erte Xiao 2009. "Do the Right Thing: But Only if Others Do So." Journal of Behavioral Decision Making, vol. 22: 191-208.

Boyd, Robert and Peter J. Richerson 1985. Culture and the Evolutionary Process. Chicago: University of Chicago Press. 

--- 2005a. The Origin and Evolution of Cultures. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

--- 2005b Not by Genes Alone: How Culture Transformed Human Evolution. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Gintis, Herbert 2009. The Bounds of Reason: Game Theory and the Unification of the Behavioral Sciences. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Rawls, John 1999. A Theory of Justice. Revised Edition. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.