Explaining Science's Success: Understanding How Scientific Knowledge Works

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John Wright, Explaining Science's Success: Understanding How Scientific Knowledge Works, Acumen, 2013, 199pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844655328.

Reviewed by Matthew J. Brown, The University of Texas at Dallas


John Wright asks an important question for general philosophy of science: why has science been so "surprisingly successful in getting things right about the natural world" (1)? While the question isn't precisely a new one, Wright makes clear that philosophers of science haven't appreciated what it takes to satisfactorily answer it. In particular, he shows that scientific realism cannot really answer the question. Further, he develops an interesting explanation for the success of science: the independence of theory from data.[1] Wright's approach is provocative and deserves attention from philosophers of science, though the way he develops his ideas leaves much to be desired.

Strictly speaking, Wright does not begin with the question of the surprising successfulness of science, but rather with a prior question, posed by Paul Feyerabend: "What's so great about science?" (Feyerabend 1976a, 310).[2] Wright acknowledges that Feyerabend's question is not answered by simply referring to the success of science in getting things right, but "because it seems to have been more successful in doing this than non-scientific or pre-scientific systems, or religion, or philosophy itself" (1). Feyerabend's question is ultimately about the epistemic and cultural authority of science, whether science is preferable to "other forms of life" (Feyerabend 1976a, 310) and, if so, what makes it so. Yet Wright fails to answer this question; he simply presumes that it is so. This is a shame, as Feyerabend's question is an important and interesting one, whose significance has generally been under-appreciated amongst philosophers of science.

Instead, the phenomena of science's success that Wright defends and seeks to explain are rather more modest: (A) that science has produced some successful novel predictions, (B) that science has produced some theories that make some true claims about parts of reality not accessible or observable at the time the theory was formulated, and (C) that scientists have occasionally advanced theories that were successful in the first two senses on "more or less a priori grounds" (1). While these phenomena are insufficient to establish the relative superiority of science, they pose interesting, difficult questions, worthy of consideration in their own right.

Chapter 1 establishes the reality of these modest phenomena, using a number of key examples to establish that there are some significant successes of all three types. Chapter 2 shows that various common explanations of these phenomena are unsatisfactory. Most challenging amongst the arguments in this chapter is that scientific realism is unsatisfactory as an explanation for science's success. Scientific realism only pushes the question back a level, from (A) how scientists have produced novel predictive success to (B) how they have produced theories that are true, approximately true, true in their working parts, right about structure, etc. Wright correctly notes that these questions are just as difficult, if not more so, than the question of novel predictive success (19). This move fails to meet one of the criteria he proposes for an adequate explanation of science's success, what he terms "the accessibility requirement": whatever explains the success of science should be more accessible than the form of success explained (35). Whether a theory is true is certainly no more accessible than whether it will have future novel predictive successes, indeed less so.

It is worth pointing out that Wright is not attempting to undercut the scientific realism debate, nor arguing against scientific realism itself. It is possible that other arguments could be made in favor of scientific realism and that the success of science might figure prominently in them, as Wright discusses in his closing pages (180-4). But scientific realism cannot explain how it is that scientists come up with successful theories, at least not with the sort of explanation Wright is looking for.

Suppose that we wish to explain the success of science by positing some property M (possibly one that is complex or highly disjunctive), such that scientists prefer theories with M. According to Wright, property M must satisfy several criteria (34-37). It must be accessible as discussed above. It must be explicable -- it must be clear why scientists have preferred M to some other property of theories. We must be able to explain why theories with M have tended to be successful. It must not be just a happy accident that scientists happen to prefer the type of theories that happen to be the successful ones; rather, the reason that theories with property M tend to be successful must be connected to why scientists prefer M. Last, the explanation via M must be operable in actual historical exemplars of the three types of success, in ways that clearly satisfy these criteria.

In Chapters 3-5, Wright argues for a particular set of explanations for the success of science. The explanations all share a certain form, which Wright calls the "basic inference of science":

Premise 1: It is [intuitively/a priori] unlikely that result E should have been obtained by chance.

Therefore: It is likely that it was not just due to chance that E was obtained.

Therefore: There is a tendency or propensity for E to be obtained. (123)

This inference-schema does most of the work for Wright. He enumerates various properties of theories such that it is intuitively unlikely that our data should fit such a theory by chance, and thus the "basic inference" explains why they should be successful. The most important such property, developed in Chapter 4, is what Wright calls "the independence of theory from data," which is meant to capture part of what is intuitively appealing about simplicity and intuitively disagreeable about ad hoc theories.

The basic idea is that independence is defined as the ratio of how many patterns of data are explained by the theory to the number of components of the theory that are based post hoc on the existing data. The more post hoc dependencies on the data or the fewer types of data explained by the theory, the more dependent that theory is on the data.[3] The more independent the theory, the less likely the data we have exemplify it by chance, so the more likely the theory captures a real tendency that will be exemplified by future data.

Chapter 5 lays out a variety of other (presumably less important) "success-conducive properties of theories," including the appearance of low whole numbers, the agreement of independent methods of arriving at a result (a sort of robustness argument that Wright calls "the AIM inference"), and symmetry. Wright also introduces some sophistication in the sorts of post hoc dependencies a theory can have on the data, and he argues that conservation laws display the maximal degree of independence from data.

These ideas for how to explain the success of science are promising and worthy of further consideration. Some seem novel (independence of theory from data, reliance on low whole numbers), while others are more familiar (robustness, symmetry). While Wright's answers to the question are worthy of consideration, I find his route to these answers rather more suspect. The arguments proceed in a way that strikes me as strange and outmoded in contemporary philosophy of science. They depend heavily on intuitive or a priori (or "relatively a priori" or "close to a priori", etc.) premises, which often concern "epistemic probabilities" stated in an informal way that makes the arguments difficult to evaluate.[4] Intuitions about generalizations such as "All ravens are black" and the patterns behind short sequences of numbers do most of the heavy lifting. Wright's route also includes some dubious detours, e.g., through Laurence BonJour's a priori justification of induction, through David Lewis's theories of reference and natural predicates, and Nelson Goodman's new riddle of induction.

Perhaps I can make clear my dismay at the way these chapters of the book proceed by some (unfair) nitpicking about the subtitle of the book, Understanding How Scientific Knowledge Works. On my reading, the book actually has very little to say about how scientific knowledge works, that is, about the work of making and using scientific knowledge. In recent years, philosophy of science has seen a major movement towards the philosophy of science in practice,[5] and this movement has had a significant positive impact on the field as a whole.[6] In particular, the philosophy of science in practice raises serious doubts about work that fails to engage in a serious way with actual scientific practice, historical or contemporary. This does not mean that the ambitions of general philosophy of science should be renounced, but that they should exist in rigorous engagement with the study of the practices of the sciences. Philosophy of science pursued in an abstract way is of questionable soundness.

Wright's book goes decidedly the opposite way, relying primarily on simplified thought experiments, intuitive judgments, and other tools of analytic epistemology. The lack of attention to scientific practice leads him to implicitly assume or assert without argument a variety of claims that are highly questionable or controversial: (1) that scientific theorizing is based primarily on inductive generalization and deductive testing rather than abductive inference; (2) that the theories so proposed are generally consistent with all of the known evidence in their domain, rather than being "born refuted" as Lakatos often argued; (3) that the production of novel predictions is a matter of logical implication easily read off a theory rather than difficult, creative work (such as puzzle-solving in the Kuhnian sense).[7]

Chapters 6-8 would seem to be positioned to eliminate these problems by presenting three major historical case studies: Newton's laws of motion and gravitation, Einstein's theory of special relativity, and Mendel's development of genetics. But on examination, these chapters don't engage in any meaningful way with scientific practice. In chapter 6 on Newton, Wright engages solely in analysis of Newton's Principia. In chapter 7 on special relativity, he relies almost exclusively on Einstein's popular book from 1920, Relativity.[8] In chapter 8, on Mendelian genetics, he relies on Mendel's reports of his experiments with a heavy dose of "rational reconstruction" of Mendel's inferences (164). In each case, Wright engages exclusively in an analysis of the theory in question and the arguments presented for the theory, with no serious analysis of experimental or observational practices. (He does report on some empirical results that motivated the theories and provided tests of novel predictions.) Furthermore, Wright takes Newton's and Einstein's arguments in support of their theories as an accurate report of the inquiries and inferences that produced their theories in the first place, a highly dubious way of inferring practices of theory-building.

The lack of attention to practice and the narrow historical record from which Wright draws his evidence in discussing these cases is compounded by a complete lack of engagement with the (enormous) historical or philosophical literature on these three figures and theories. Doubtless there are a number of significant lacunae in these chapters as a result of these flaws in Wright's approach; I will mention just two. First, in discussion of Newton's (in)famous four "rules of reasoning in philosophy," Wright presents an interesting argument that each of these rules is a heuristic tending to increase the independence of theory from data, and thus tending to produce novel predictive success. Here, however, he fails to engage with the very significant controversies on interpreting and evaluating Newton's rules.[9] Newton's approach to the method of science is a lively field of debate whose controversies he simply ignores. Second, Wright's discussion of special relativity repeats the myth that the Michelson-Morley experiment was a driving force in Einstein's creation of the theory of relativity (144-5). There is dispute amongst philosophers and historians about whether this is so, with Einstein himself having claimed, later in life, that he was not aware of any influence of that experiment on his thinking. Wright shows no sensitivity to this or any other difficulty in the historical reconstruction of Einstein's work.

Doubtless some will think I am being unfair to Wright. Shouldn't we encourage the use of many different tools for doing philosophy of science, the tools of analytic epistemology included? Does everyone need to be doing philosophy of scientific practice? I would be the first to insist on encouraging variety in theories and approaches in philosophy of science, and the first to stand up for general philosophy of science as a valuable part of the field. Nevertheless, I think philosophy of science in the mode pursued by Wright, almost completely disengaged from science as it is practiced, based only on abstract analysis of toy examples and the contents of theory, is of dubious value to the field.

I have a number of more minor concerns about the book that I will briefly enumerate. (1) The strange lack of engagement with the relevant literature is not only a problem for the historical chapters, but for the book as a whole.[10] (2) The bibliography is surprisingly spare (47 entries) and light on references from this century (just six, half of them on BonJour), to specialist journals in philosophy of science (just two), and by women (apparently zero).[11] (3) The book does not seem to have been very well edited; it has a number of typos (including in names and titles in the bibliography) and some glaringly repetitive language. The index is rather incomplete.

Despite my concerns about the way in which Wright argues in the book, let me reiterate that I do believe the book gets off to a good start. It asks an interesting question, how to explain the success of science, and rightly argues that the most common answers to that question, scientific realism included, fail to live up to the standards that such explanations ought to meet. I also believe that the core answer he gives, the independence of theory from data, is well worth further exploration. I sincerely hope the idea is taken up and examined by philosophers of science interested in this question, in light of an understanding of the practices of the sciences.


Barker, Gillian, and Philip Kitcher. 2014. Philosophy of Science: A New Introduction. Oxford University Press.

Feyerabend, Paul K. 1970. "Classical empiricism." In The Methodological Heritage of Newton, ed. Robert E. Butts and John Whitney Davis, 150-70. Toronto: University of Toronto Press.

------. 1976a. "On the Critique of Scientific Reason." In Method and Appraisal in the Physical Sciences: Method and appraisal in the physical sciences The Critical Background to Modern Science, 1800-1905, ed. Colin Howson, 309-39. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

------. 1976b. "On the Critique of Scientific Reason." In Essays in Memory of Imre Lakatos, ed. Robert Cohen, Paul K. Feyerabend, and Marx Wartofsky, 39:109-43. Dordrecht: Springer.

------. 1978. Science in a Free Society. New Left Books.

------. 1993. Against Method. 3rd ed. Verso.

Fitzpatrick, Simon. 2013. "Kelly on Ockham's Razor and Truth-Finding Efficiency." Philosophy of Science 80 (2): 298-309.

van Fraassen, Bas C. 1997. "Sola Experientia? -- Feyerabend's Refutation of Classical Empiricism." Philosophy of Science 64 (Supplement. Proceedings of the 1996 Biennial Meetings of the Philosophy of Science Association. Part II: Symposia Papers): S385-S395.

Harper, William L. 2011. Isaac Newton's Scientific Method: Turning Data Into Evidence about Gravity and Cosmology. Oxford University Press.

Kidd, Ian James. 2010. "The True, the Good, and the Value of Science." In Proceedings of the Thirteenth Durham Bergen Conference, ed. David Kirkby and Ulrich Reichard.

Miyake, Teru. 2013. "William Harper: Isaac Newton's Scientific Method." Philosophy of Science 80 (2): 310-316.

Wright, John. 1991. Science and the theory of rationality. Aldershot, Hants, England: Avebury.

[1]He proposed this idea in an earlier book (Wright 1991).

[2]See also Feyerabend (1976b, 110), Feyerabend (1978, 73ff), Feyerabend (1993, 238ff). Wright cites Feyerabend on p. 1. See Kidd (2010) for discussion.

[3]I've attempted to state the view in somewhat less technical terms than Wright deploys in the book.

[4]E.g., claims about what states of affairs are likely seem sensitive to background assumptions that would render many of Wright's arguments unsound.

[5]Including the founding of a Society for Philosophy of Science in Practice (SPSP) in 2006. Click for the mission of the SPSP.

[6]Chapters 3-6 of Barker and Kitcher (2014) give an overview of the current state of the field that makes this clear.

[7]Also, a familiarity with the relevant science makes the repeated assumption that color is a good example of a monadic, natural property seem rather odd.

[8]Wright does mention a few papers that report successful experimental tests of special relativity's novel predictions.

[9]For a start, one might look at Feyerabend (1970) and van Fraassen (1997), then read the recent review of Harper (2011) in Philosophy of Science (Miyake 2013). Then there is the work of George Smith, Eric Schliesser, and many others.

[10]One small example: Wright's discussion seems very relevant to Kevin Kelly's view on Occam's Razor, also discussed recently in Philosophy of Science (Fitzpatrick 2013). There are many such potential connections in the book.

[11]Why is it important that Wright cites no women in the entire book? I would recommend readers have a look at the discussions at the Feminist Philosophers blog, particularly the "Gendered Citation Campaign" and "Gendered Conference Campaign." See also the APA Committee on the Status of Women in the Profession resources on Advancing Women in Philosophy  for links and papers on these issues.