Explaining Social Behavior: More Nuts and Bolts for the Social Sciences

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Jon Elster, Explaining Social Behavior: More Nuts and Bolts for the Social Sciences, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 484pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521777445.

Reviewed by Harold Kincaid, University of Alabama at Birmingham


The first book I read by Jon Elster was Making Sense of Marx (1985). It was a refreshing attempt to get some clarity on Marx's social science. It brought concepts from game theory to an area where they had not been applied before, and Elster went on to be crucial in making game theory ideas popular in political science. Elster also defended a philosophy of social science there that consisted of some form of methodological individualism and deep skepticism about functionalism in the social sciences. I found the philosophy of social science implausible and not well defended, but the book was full of material new to me and admirable in trying to put greater content in some vague ideas in Marx.

Now, over twenty years later, Elster has published innumerable books, so many that Cambridge catalogues have a section entitled "Books By Jon Elster" along with their subject area categories. Elster's latest addition is Explaining Social Behavior: More Nuts and Bolts for the Social Sciences, which is a greatly expanded version of his original Nuts and Bolts for the Social Sciences (1989). It provides Elster's most recent statement of his philosophy of the social sciences and his vision for how social science is to be done. Unfortunately, the initial vision of Making Sense of Marx has degenerated into an unpromising picture of social science as largely built on folk wisdom and insights from literature about human nature. The "nuts and bolts" have also not advanced much, and the current volume describes elementary commonly known concepts such as expected utility and the prisoner's dilemma that would now already be in the tool kit of anyone with a decent undergraduate education in the social sciences. This is true in political science in part because of Elster's early work.

The book consists of five sections: "Explanation and Mechanisms," "The Mind," "Action," "Lessons from the Natural Sciences," and "Interaction." Each section is composed of brief chapters with titles such as "Emotions" or "Rational Choice." The first section is explicitly about the philosophy of the social sciences, though Elster's vision is discussed or instantiated throughout the book.

The basic philosophy of social science claims are these:

1.) "In principle, explanations in the social sciences should refer only to individuals and their actions." (p. 13)

2.) All explanation is causal.

3.) Causal explanations are different from true causal statements. "To cite a cause is not enough: the causal mechanism must be provided, or at least suggested." (p. 21)

4.) A mechanism is a "frequently occurring and easily recognizable causal pattern." (p. 36)

5.) "Proverbial folk wisdom has identified many such mechanisms" and is a main and perhaps the main source of evidence in the social sciences. (p. 37)

6.) "Interpreting an action requires us to explain it in terms of the antecedent beliefs and desires of the agent." (p. 53)

7.) With very few exceptions the social sciences cannot rely on functional explanation, which accounts for action or behavioral patterns by citing their consequences.

8.) "The subjective factor of choice has greater explanatory power than the objective factors of constraints and selection." (p. 6)

These claims are simply proclaimed at almost every turn and are given no clear explication; arguments in their favor are not advanced, and objections are not considered. Almost none of the extensive philosophy of social science literature discussing these issues is mentioned.

As anybody familiar with the literature in the last two decades in the philosophy of the social sciences will recognize, these claims are in need of clarification and defense. In a short review such as this I can only point briefly to the most obvious difficulties.

A vast amount of social science research is about aggregate level entities such as institutions, organizations, firms, and states. A vast amount of social research about the behavior of individuals is of individuals in roles and positions in institutions, organizations, etc. A dominant view in current cognitive science is that explanations of individual mental processes cannot be given in purely individualist (internal) terms. These results present a strong prima facie case against the idea that social science can be done "by referring only to individuals." Institutions, etc. are, to use the language of debates over reductionism, multiply realized in the behavior of individuals -- there are many different ways to organize people into a profit seeking firm, for example. Explanations at the level of institutions seem often to identify causal processes not explained entirely in terms of individual behavior. Moreover, explanations of individual behavior are consistently given by taking the institutional context as given and then explaining individual behavior in terms of it. For example, the refinements program in rational choice game theory has found that nearly any set of strategies can be an equilibrium and that outcomes are extremely sensitive to institutional detail. Institutions are not derived from rational choices of agents but are instead essential to explanations invoking them.

The doubts about functional explanation and about structural constraints are dubious for related reasons. Social science explanations frequently identify patterns which seem to be only discernible at more macro scales. A nice example is Becker's (1976b) demonstration that the law of demand can be shown to follow from budget constraints and purely random individual choices, showing that in the most choice based of the sciences, microeconomics, structural constraints play a central role. Similarly functional explanations that show why some practice persists because of a feedback loop from its effects to its reproduction are common and powerful social explanations (Kincaid 2006). Some such process, for example, must underlie the constraints that produce efficient market outcomes, a possibility that Elster dismisses in a paragraph. Evolutionary game theory is all about such processes where consequences explain the reproduction of strategies, is some of the more promising work in current social science, and is completely ignored by Elster.

The claims about mechanisms are more plausible, but they have minimal content. Since a mechanism is on Elster's view a causal pattern, it is hard to see how identifying the cause of a social event does not explain it as Elster claims -- mechanisms are defined in terms of causes by Elster. Moreover, the notion of "mechanisms" is ambiguous as well. Mechanisms can either be horizontal -- between the cause and effect -- or vertical, viz. the component realizers of the process which may be at different levels of description. In either case we explain all the time in everyday affairs and in the sciences without providing a mechanism in either sense, e.g. every time we do not provide the quantum mechanical details when providing a causal explanation. Maybe all social science explanation is about causation. However, since many think that explanation in the physical sciences is often not about causation but instead about systematic unification, these alternative possibilities need to be taken seriously in the social sciences as well, and obviously the issues require much more than the few sentences of analysis that Elster gives.

The idea that human action must be explained in terms of the beliefs and desires of the agent is something that I would have thought empirical science had shown false long ago. There has been for some time a strong social science literature arguing that attitudes do little to explain behavior and the last twenty years of cognitive science has consistently argued that much behavior is not explained by folk psychological concepts of desire and belief. Many cognitive scientists believe that most behavior is not best explained in these terms. Much cognitive science is about things like navigation, clock-keeping, and microscale reward valuation that is regarded as implicit and not proposition-like even though it involves representation.

These results along with the reasons given above for thinking that structural constraints play large roles make it extremely dubious to think that common folk proverbs and literature will provide much evidence at all, not to mention the best or main evidence, in the social sciences. Elster's book favors this kind of "evidence" while almost entirely ignoring the vast body of social and cognitive science evidence accumulated on the explanation of behavior. Not surprisingly the most cited researcher on human behavior in Elster's discussion is Tocqueville. Thus the "nuts and bolts" Elster offers are a weak imitation of the real causal explanations the social and behavioral sciences provide these days. Of course as befits the promise of Making Sense of Marx, some of the nuts and bolts of the current volume, such as expected utility and the prisoner's dilemma, are still mainstays of current social science. If these notions are unfamiliar to you, Elster's book is one place to learn something about them, though you will not get anything like a survey of the state of play in social research using these tools.


Becker, Gary. 1976a. The Economic Approach to Human Behavior. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

Becker, Gary. 1976b. "Irrational Behavior and Economic Theory," in Becker (1976a).

Elster, Jon. 1985. Making Sense of Marx. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Elster, Jon. 1989. Nuts and Bolts for the Social Sciences. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Kincaid, Harold. 2006. "Functional Explanation and Evolutionary Social Science," in  Mark Risjord and Stephen Turner (eds.), Handbook for the Philosophy of Science: Philosophy of Anthropology and Sociology (Elsevier, 2006), pp. 213-249.