Explaining the Cosmos: The Ionian Tradition of Scientific Philosophy

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Daniel W. Graham, Explaining the Cosmos: The Ionian Tradition of Scientific Philosophy, Princeton University Press, 2006, 368pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691125406.

Reviewed by Scott Austin, Texas A&M University


Daniel W. Graham's Explaining the Cosmos is not only philosophy and scholarship, but also intellectual history, with a keen eye for culture and poetry as well as for drier questions in the interpretation of Ancient Greek texts.  It is a masterful and detailed exposition of a radical way of seeing the Ionians and their critics as progenitors of the tradition in natural science to which we ourselves belong.  Its concluding chapters would be useful for undergraduates; its scholarly footnotes, often reaching back to the earliest nineteenth-century commentators as well as to the Greeks who commented on other Greeks, habitually turn up ground left untouched by other reputable writers.

The book's central claim is that the earliest Ionians were not naïve monists who crudely anticipated the later role of material factors in Aristotelianism, and that later figures such as Empedocles, Anaxagoras, and the Atomists were not naïve pluralists who missed the point of a powerful Eleatic critique.  This rehabilitative claim is radical, and Graham is well aware of what needs to be supplied in order to support it.  Here is a rough and condensed version of his story, though it would be hard to improve on his own conclusion for clarity of exposition:  Material Monism (abbreviated MM), in which one original substance, while remaining the same with itself, undergoes modifications which ultimately generate the world we see, is not what Thales, Anaximander, and Anaximenes were committed to, in spite of Aristotle's apparent testimony to the contrary.  Instead (and this is particularly visible in Anaximenes) they were committed to what Graham calls the Generating Substance Theory (abbreviated GST), in which non-identical primary realities transform into each other.  (One of these substances may be first in time, and perhaps also first in power, but it is not first in any underlying ontological sense.)  In MM, the first principle is not annihilated during the series of cosmic transformations; in GST, each successive stage is annihilated as it gives way to the next stage.  Heraclitus then sees, with a heavy dash of irony, the difficulties with GST:  Where is there metaphysical reality if all there is is process?  Let us bite the bullet and swallow a 'process philosophy' (Graham's term) instead.  Now Parmenides, in this picture, instead of radicalizing a preexisting monism and making it transcendent, appears as the first real monist, at least in the 'strong' version of Eleaticism; the 'weak' version allows for plurality, as in the interpretations of Mourelatos, Barnes, Curd, and Hermann, and thus allows Empedocles and Anaxagoras to think that they are being faithful to Eleaticism in some sense, by putting forth elements which enduringly retain the same natures and (unlike as in GST) do not perish into each other.  'Weak' Eleaticism also allows Graham to suppose a possible constructive, rather than a merely dismissive, role for the mortal cosmology in the Parmenidean 'Opinion' section.  This is also rehabilitative, in that Empedocles and Anaxagoras are no longer (as in one traditional interpretation) being represented as simply missing Parmenides' point.  Zeno and Melissus then counter with a renewed 'strong' Eleaticism; the Atomists answer by countering that what-is-not (Void) is in some sense, thus undercutting the fundamental Eleatic distinction; and it is then left for Diogenes of Apollonia, often dismissed as the sort of coffee-table intellectual who could have been publicly satirized by Aristophanes, to be the real inventor of MM (though it is an MM influenced by his immediate predecessors), thus flavoring Aristotle's picture of the earliest Ionians as well.  On this account, Graham claims, the entire set of dialectical moves works within new and sophisticated constraints on explanation, constraints which we can now attribute to very early figures, and each figure has something new and historically influential to say.

In what follows I raise questions for Graham's account.  First, it is not always clear to me why Aristotle seems to count as an authority in some places and not in others.  If the earliest Ionians were committed to GST instead of to MM, then Aristotle must have been wrong about them.  Graham supplies an explanation -- the proximity of Diogenes -- for why Aristotle might have been wrong.  But he also points to the use of the words gignesthai in Simplicius' exposition and apogonoi in Hippolytus' to support the claim that Anaximenes believed in the sort of absolute coming-to-be which would contradict MM.  And then Aristotle's (often questioned) testimony about the Parmenidean 'Opinion'-section is used in support of the possibility that that section might have been (however tentatively) a serious cosmology.  It would be helpful to know more about what general principles of interpretation are at issue here -- perhaps to have a hierarchy for the reliability of earlier and later ancient sources.

Second, also important in Graham's picture of Anaximenes is the account of a cosmic cycle given in the Timaeus.  For Graham, along with Taylor, Cornford, and Vlastos, this is specifically a summary of Anaximenes' philosophy.  Graham writes (77):  "Evidently Plato believes that he can accept the sequence of changes, the mechanism, and the model of felting, without any commitment to a single underlying matter that stays the same throughout the change."  I do not see why the Timaeus is not thought of as postulating the receptacle as just such a sort of underlying matter, precisely in an attempt to improve on an MM that Plato is then, by implication, attributing to Anaximenes.

Third, it is not clear to me from Graham's text whether change in physical location is ruled out in Eleaticism, whether 'strong' or 'weak'.  Parmenides specifically rules out change of place by denying topon allassein dia (B8.41), if not with the assertions of atremes (B8.4) and akinÄ“ton (B8.26 & 38).  Yet Graham's account of 'weak' Eleaticism seems to focus on the question of plurality.  Does the postulation of change of place by Empedocles and Anaxagoras in fact contradict 'weak' Eleaticism, or does it just contradict 'strong' Eleaticism?  If the former, then we are back in the embarrassing situation of the traditional account:  the later cosmologists did not fully appreciate Parmenides.  If the latter, then 'weak' Eleaticism appears to contradict the Parmenidean text.

Fourth, how serious a cosmology is the Parmenidean 'Opinion'-section?  Graham wants to say that its use of elements with fixed natures was sincere enough so that Empedocles and Anaxagoras, in copying it, would not have been misunderstanding Parmenides.  Yet he also wants to say, following Mourelatos, that the 'Opinion'-section might have been ironically intended.  Is it possible to say both these things?

Fifth, it cannot be that we are to attribute to the Atomists a discovery that some negative language, especially negative predication, is -- contra Parmenides -- admissible, and so Void is admissible.  For Parmenides' own use of negative predications in the 'Truth'-section is well-known, and the speaker-goddess, if that section is meant as descriptive ontology, is not to be taken as violating her precepts in the act of specifying them.

Sixth, there is the question of Graham's own philosophical presuppositions.  These are occasionally visible in writing like this (173):  "To abandon explaining experience for some sort of theoretical unity is an indefensible move.  If this account [of the 'Opinion'-section as the rejection of cosmology] is true, then Parmenides is a bad philosopher" or like this (259-60):  "If, moreover, we reject experience [by which here Graham means sense-experience], what will we have to explain?  If philosophy is an attempt to explain our experience, but there is no experience, what need is there of philosophy?"  Here one fears that an attempt to assess the philosophical value of certain Presocratics in terms of how closely they may support an empiricist theory may wind up denying the possibility of any rehabilitation to those very philosophers.

Daniel Graham's book deserves to be pondered and universally read by anyone interested in a radical theory of what the Presocratics may still have to teach us.