Explanation and Teleology in Aristotle's Science of Nature

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Mariska Leunissen, Explanation and Teleology in Aristotle's Science of Nature, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 250pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521197748.

Reviewed by Devin Henry, University of Western Ontario


No idea is more synonymous with Aristotle and none more fundamental to Aristotelian philosophy than teleology. So it is quite remarkable that there have been only two full-length monographs in English exclusively devoted to the subject -- Monte Johnson's Aristotle on Teleology (OUP 2005) and now Mariska Leunissen's Explanation and Teleology in Aristotle's Science of Nature. (There is one other monograph in Italian: D. Quarantotto, 2005, Causa finale, sostanza, essenza in Aristotele, Saggi sulla struttura dei processi teleologici naturali e sulla funzione dei telos, Napoli: Bibliopolis.) The strength of Leunissen's book, which sets it apart from other discussions of Aristotle's teleology, is that her interpretation is developed from a careful analysis of Aristotle's actual use of teleological explanations in the biological works, which is where most of the interesting material is to be found. She examines an impressive assortment of textual examples and offers a detailed exposition of their content. The result is a rich account of how Aristotle thinks teleological causation operates in nature and how final causes are to be integrated into a more comprehensive picture of explanation in natural science. Explanation and Teleology in Aristotle's Science of Nature is an important contribution to scholarship on Aristotle's teleology. And while Leunissen's will certainly not be the last word on the subject, her book has added significantly to the debate and must be engaged with by anyone wishing to tackle the subject from this point forward.

The main argument of the book is organized around three central ideas. First, Leunissen argues that in order to grasp Aristotle's teleology we need to make a distinction between two types of teleological causation, what she calls "primary" and "secondary" teleology. Second, explanations in natural science often make use of teleological principles (such as "nature does nothing in vain") which, according to Leunissen, function as heuristic devices: they are deployed by the natural scientist to help uncover those causally relevant features that are to be picked out in ultimate explanations. Third, the scientific value of final causes for Aristotle lies in their having explanatory rather than causal priority. Among other things, this has significance for how we understand Aristotle's puzzling remarks about demonstrations through final causes in Posterior Analytics II 11. My review will be devoted to a critical assessment of these three claims. And while I take issue with several aspects of Leunissen's interpretation, overall I found her arguments both illuminating and persuasive.

Primary versus Secondary Teleology

While Leunissen has something to say about elemental motion and heavenly bodies (see esp. Chapter 5), her central focus is on living things and their parts. This seems justified. For Aristotle twice says living things are substances "most of all" (Metaphysics 1041b28-31, 1043b19-23), and so we should expect organisms to exhibit teleology in the strictest sense. Leunissen's distinctive contribution to our understanding of Aristotle's natural teleology is her claim that, when it comes to organisms at least, Aristotle distinguishes two patterns of teleological causation:

In the first case, it is the presence of a preexisting potential for form that guides the actions of the formal nature and that thereby directs the teleological process of its realization. In the second case, it is the presence of certain material potentials that allows for certain teleological uses (and not for others); the actions of the formal nature in making use of these materials are secondary to the operation of material necessity that produced the materials in the first place. Both processes thus involve the goal-directed action of the formal nature -- which is why both processes qualify as being teleological, but in the first case, the actions are primarily 'driven by form' (e.g., the form of flyer requires the production of wings), in the second, they are primarily 'driven by matter' (e.g., the availability of hard materials allows for the production of protective parts like horns and hair). (p. 20; for a full discussion see pp. 18-22, 85-99)

According to Leunissen, primary teleology involves realizing a "preexisting potential for form". (If I may borrow a modern analogy, think of the execution of an inherited program that codes for certain traits.) Here the form being realized constitutes the final cause of the process leading up to it, while that process is said to be "for the sake of" that form precisely because it is the actualization of a potential for that end. Leunissen argues that this kind of teleological causation is associated with those parts that Aristotle describes as "conditionally necessary" for the execution of an organism's vital (survival) or essential (kind-defining) functions. Secondary teleology, by contrast, is at work in cases where Aristotle speaks of the formal nature "using" raw materials that have come to be owing to material (rather than conditional) necessity in order to bring about some good end. The parts that result from this type of causation are present, not because they are indispensable for the execution of some vital or essential function, but because they contribute in some way to the organism's well-being. As Leunissen puts it, secondary teleology generates parts that are present not for the sake of living but for living well (p. 19; see also pp. 89-95).

For example, suppose we define fish as blooded swimmers that cool themselves by taking in water. Like all blooded animals, fish must have a liver and a heart in order to survive (PA IV 12, 677a36-b5). And since they are (by definition) swimmers that breath in water, they must also have fins and gills. These parts are all included in the basic design of a fish, whose construction is coded in the developmental program executed by its formal nature (Leunissen's "potential for form"). Now suppose that certain materials arise during development that are not coded by the program but come to be, say, as a necessary byproduct of the process of making fins. Not being wasteful, nature will make use of this matter to add to the basic fish design. It may add a lateral line to help the fish better detect prey or it may give it a dorsal fin equipped with hard spines for added protection. None of these additional parts are absolutely required for being a fish, in the sense that nature could have designed a fish without those parts, but instead they are added to make the fish's life better in some way. In Leunissen's scheme, they are the result of "secondary" teleology.

On this interpretation, primary and secondary teleology are divided along two axes: in terms of the nature of the causal process involved (the former involves the actualization of a "preexisting potential for form" operating through "conditional necessity", while the latter involves the formal nature "using" extra materials whose presence is due to "material necessity") and in terms of the status of the parts that result from those processes (the former underwrites the formation of parts that are absolutely required for existence, while the latter underwrites the formation of subsidiary parts that contribute to the organism's well-being). Given the presence of these two patterns of teleological causation, Leunissen argues that in order to understand any particular application of natural teleology we must determine whether the formation of the end that constitutes the final cause is primarily driven by form (primary teleology) or by matter (secondary teleology). Chapter 4, §4.3 identifies two patterns of teleological explanations where the form is the causally primary factor and three patterns where the matter is the causally primary factor. The distinction between primary and secondary teleology forms the heart of Leunissen's interpretation, so I shall spend some time developing my evaluation of this idea before turning to her other two theses.

There are two ways that someone might respond to Leunissen here. First, one might agree that Aristotle makes a distinction between necessary parts that are present because the animal could not exist without them and subsidiary parts that are present because they contribute to its well-being (e.g., GA I 4, 717a15-17) but deny that this tracks a real distinction between kinds of teleological causation. For example, in GA II 6 Aristotle tells us how the formal nature can "use" materially necessitated changes to achieve its developmental goals (743a36-b8), which sounds like Leunissen's account of secondary teleology. Yet the parts that Aristotle attributes to this kind of teleological causation here include flesh, bones and sinew -- parts that are all necessary for the existence of an animal. Again, in GA II 4 we are told that the formal nature makes use of things that arise "from [material] necessity" for the sake of producing a set of extraembryonic membranes around the embryo (739b26-32). These are again not subsidiary parts that somehow enhance the animal's way of life but are absolutely critical for its very survival; for no embryo could survive to adulthood unless it was surrounded by such membranes. Both of these examples suggest that the distinction Aristotle makes between necessary and subsidiary parts cannot be neatly mapped onto the distinction Leunissen sees between primary and secondary teleological causation.

The other way one might respond to Leunissen's interpretation is to deny that Aristotle's natural teleology can be divided into two discrete forms. In distinguishing primary teleology from secondary teleology Leunissen has certainly put her finger on some important differences in the way Aristotle understands teleological causation. But these differences may turn out to be more nuanced and continuous than Leunissen's strict dichotomy allows. Consider the following three examples, all of which involve final causation to different degrees:

Case 1. Fins (cf. PA IV 13, 695b17-26). Both the raw materials and the part itself come to be for the sake of the function eventually performed by that part (e.g., swimming). Here all (or at least most) aspects of the part's development can be traced to the goal-directed actions of the animal's formal nature.

Case 2. Horns (PA III 2, 663b21-22). In this case the formal nature takes raw materials that are already present owing to material (rather than conditional) necessity and fashions them into an organ capable of performing some useful function (e.g., defense).

Case 3. Omentum (PA IV 3, 677b21-8). Both the raw materials and the part itself come to be through material necessity alone. Here all aspects of the part's development can be traced to non-teleological changes arising from the organism's material nature. But once the part has come into being, it is then put to work in the mature organism for some useful function.

Leunissen identifies case (1) with primary teleology and cases (2) and (3) with secondary teleology (for the latter see Leunissen, pp. 92-5). But this dichotomy effaces certain similarities and differences between the three cases that seem equally important for understanding Aristotle's use of teleology.

First, as Leunissen notes, (1) differs from (2) and (3) in terms of the origins of the raw materials. In (1) the matter that is used to make the part is there because it is required for that part to perform its function. As Aristotle puts it, the matter is "conditionally necessary" for that end. By contrast, the raw materials used in (2) and (3) do not come to be for the sake of anything but owe their existence to material necessity alone. With horns, for example, Aristotle says that nature "borrows (katakechrêtai)" materials that are "present of necessity" (tois huparchousin ek anankês) for the sake of making something good (PA 663b21-2). However, there is also an important sense in which case (2) resembles case (1), which distinguishes them both from case (3). As Leunissen herself notes, in both (1) and (2) the development of the part itself is controlled by the goal-directed actions of the formal nature operating for the sake of an end (p. 20). Horns are made for defense just as much as fins are made for swimming. The fact that horns are made from raw materials that happen to result from non-teleological forces seems to be of little significance when compared with the teleological processes involved in transforming those materials into a functioning organ. At least Leunissen gives us no reason to think that in such cases the teleological actions of the formal nature in constructing the part should be considered "secondary" to the non-teleological changes that produced the raw materials on which it operates. The distinction between (1) and (2) thus seems to be more a difference in emphasis than a difference in kind.

With (1) and (2), then, the parts in question are both generated by the formal nature aiming at a specific goal, which allows us to say that those parts come to be for the sake of their functions (pace Leunissen, p. 95). With (3) the part in question is simply used by the mature organism for some useful function, but it did not come to be for that reason since its generation was driven entirely by material-level forces operating independently of teleological causation. This seems to warrant grouping (1) and (2) in opposition to (3) from the perspective of the developmental process itself.

To accommodate this, one might accept Leunissen's basic distinction between kinds of teleology but insist on a third kind of "tertiary" teleology. Like cases of secondary teleology, tertiary teleology would involve parts whose raw materials are present owing to material necessity alone. However, they differ from cases of secondary teleology in that the part itself also results from material necessity, whereas in secondary teleology (like primary teleology) the actual formation of the part from those materials is still governed by the goal-directed activities of the formal nature. Alternatively, one might agree with Leunissen that there are important differences in the way Aristotle understands teleological causation but deny that these can be captured by discrete and mutually exclusive categories. Instead (the objection goes) Aristotle sees those differences as a matter of degree so that any attempt to draw sharp divisions between "kinds of teleology" involves imposing artificial boundaries on something that is ultimately continuous.

Teleological Principles as Heuristic Devices

In addition to standard teleological explanations of the form "X is/comes to be for the sake of Y", Leunissen also considers Aristotle's use of various teleological principles, which she describes as "generalizations over the goal-directed actions of the formal nature (or soul) of an animal while engaged in animal generation" (p. 119). These include such principles as nature does nothing in vain (IA 2, 704b12-17), nature does everything either because it is (conditionally) necessary or because it is better (GA I 4, 717a15-16) and nature only provides weapons to those that can use them (PA III 1, 661b27-32). What is the epistemological status of such principles? How do they fit into Aristotle's broader philosophy of science? According to one view, such teleological principles function as explicit premises in biological demonstrations.[1] Against this Leunissen argues that their role is best characterized as heuristic. Such principles help point the natural scientist towards those causally relevant factors that are to be picked out in the ultimate explanations of phenomena -- explanations, moreover, whose premises will make no reference to those principles as causes (p. 112). Leunissen offers three reasons for why such principles cannot function as premises in demonstrations (pp. 122-3), though I shall leave it to the reader to assess the merits of her arguments.

I suspect that the right interpretation lies somewhere between these two views. There are definitely cases where Aristotle uses teleological principles heuristically. For example, in GA II 5 Aristotle asks why males exist in addition to females. To help resolve this puzzle Aristotle invokes the principle that nature does nothing in vain: since nature makes nothing in vain, males must make some contribution to generation. But the principle doesn't explain anything; for it doesn't tell us what that contribution is. Instead, it simply prompts us to consider what it is that females are unable to supply by examining embryos that are generated parthenogenetically. (For another example see GA I 4, 717a11-21 and Leunissen's discussion on pp. 125-7.) But not all uses of teleological principles function in this way. Sometimes the fact captured by the principle is one of those causally relevant features that cannot be eliminated from the final account without crucial loss of explanatory content (e.g., IA VIII, 708a10-20; GA II 6, 744a34-744b1). If this is right, then Aristotle's teleological principles should not be seen as performing any single function in his natural science. Sometimes they are used as heuristic devices that help us find the causally relevant features to be cited in the ultimate explanation, and other times they capture basic facts about the world that are among those causally relevant features themselves, whether those facts alone provide the ultimate explanation so that no further facts are needed to explain the phenomenon in question or whether they simply form an ineliminable part of that ultimate explanation along with other causally relevant facts.

The Importance of Final Causes

Let me turn briefly to Leunissen's third thesis. One of the main questions raised by Aristotle's teleology is why he thinks natural science must have recourse to final causes at all. Why are final causes indispensable to the science of nature? Leunissen's position lies somewhere between the interpretation that says Aristotle's final causes play a mere heuristic role[2] and the interpretation that sees his commitment to final causes as stemming from a belief that natural phenomena cannot come to be by material necessity alone.[3] In contrast to the latter interpretation, Leunissen argues that Aristotle's attraction to teleology derives primarily from his belief that inquiring into final causes is the most effective method for acquiring scientific knowledge (p. 209). The functions and goals that constitute final causes are usually obvious to perception and as such provide the best starting points for discovering other causally relevant properties and changes related to the explanandum (p. 211). For Aristotle, those properties and changes are all equally opaque from a mechanistic point of view; they only become salient when organisms and their parts are studied as teleologically organized wholes (see Resp. 3, 471b24-9). In this way Leunissen argues that the importance of final causes lies in their explanatory priority:

Through the investigation of natural phenomena from a teleological viewpoint, one is able to distinguish the causally relevant features of those phenomena, and thereby to discover the features that are to be included in the complete explanation of them. The identification of final causes thus helps to frame the search for material, formal and efficient causes of some phenomenon and thereby to find its complete causal explanation. (p. 211)

At the same time Leunissen is careful to distance her interpretation from the so-called Kantian reading that sees Aristotle's final causes as merely heuristic. On that reading, Aristotle thinks it is useful to look at nature as if it was governed by final causes, since adopting a teleological perspective helps to identify the real (i.e., material-efficient) causes of things. Since Aristotle thinks final causes have no ontological significance, he thinks natural science can dispense with them once the true causes have been found. Leunissen denies that this is Aristotle's view (p. 112). On her reading, Aristotle sees natural science as a search for the ultimate causes of natural phenomena, and these include final causes. Those final causes have real ontological force and constitute an ineliminable feature of Aristotle's world. Living things really are teleologically organized wholes whose generation is controlled by the goal-directed actions of their formal natures.

Overall Assessment

The back cover jacket describes the intended audience for this book as "those who are interested in Aristotle's natural science, his philosophy of science, and his biology". But given the significance of teleology, not only for Aristotle's own philosophy but for the history of philosophy in general, this book will be of interest to a much broader audience. While the reader is assumed to have some familiarity with Aristotle's philosophy of nature, Leunissen's discussion is quite accessible. Most technical concepts are explained and illustrated with examples, and she offers an abundance of textual evidence in support of her claims. The merits of Leunissen's book are by no means exhausted by the ideas I have discussed in this review. And my criticisms should in no way be taken as a negative assessment of its overall achievements. Leunissen has many important things to say about the positive role that material necessity plays in Aristotle's account of teleology, about Aristotle's famous defense of teleology in Physics II 8, how the doctrine of final causes is integrated into the theory of demonstration in Posterior Analytics II 11 and how this compares with Aristotle's actual practice of providing teleological explanations in the biological works, and what the limits of teleology are vis-à-vis Aristotle's understanding of cosmology. Readers may not agree with Leunissen's views at every turn, but there is certainly no shortage of philosophically engaging ideas in her book.

[1] James Lennox, "Nature Does Nothing in Vain", in J. Lennox (ed.), Aristotle's Philosophy of Biology: Studies in the Origins of Life Science, Cambridge University Press, 2001, pp. 205-224.

[2] Wolfgang Wieland, "The Problem of Teleology", in J. Barnes, M. Schofield, R. Sorabji (eds.), Articles on Aristotle, Duckworth Academic Press, 1975, pp. 141-160.

[3] Allan Gotthelf, "Aristotle's Conception of Final Causality", in A. Gotthelf and J.G. Lennox (eds.), Philosophical Issues in Aristotle's Biology, Cambridge University Press, 1987, pp. 204-242.