Explanation in Ethics and Mathematics: Debunking and Dispensability

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Uri D. Leibowitz and Neil Sinclair (eds.), Explanation in Ethics and Mathematics: Debunking and Dispensability, Oxford University Press, 2016, 257pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198778592.

Reviewed by Karl Schafer, University of California, Irvine


This collection brings together two groups of essays, unified by a concern for the relevance of explanatory considerations to metaethics and philosophy of mathematics. The first group (by Justin Clarke-Doane, Folke Tersman, Toby Handfield, Erik J. Wielenberg, Hallvard Lillehammer) focuses on the potential negative role of such considerations. More precisely, these essays discuss "evolutionary debunking arguments" -- for example, arguments that aim to show that the evolutionary origins of our moral faculties undermine our entitlement to treat these faculties as tracking "realistically-construed" moral facts.[1] The second group of essays (by Alexander Miller, David Liggins, Debbie Roberts, Mary Leng, Alan Baker) focuses on the potential positive role for explanatory considerations -- with special attention to "arguments from indispensability" in metaethics and philosophy of mathematics. Both of the sections conclude with a reply by a major proponent of the relevant strategy (Richard Joyce and David Enoch, respectively).

The essays are generally excellent and are well worth reading for those interested in these debates. But given the recent explosion of work on these issues, it's not unreasonable to ask what exactly this volume aims to contribute. The editors see its distinctive contributions as resulting largely from two factors. The first is the volume's focus on comparing the connections between explanation and realism across metaethics, philosophy of mathematics, and related fields. The second is its interest in broadening these debates so that they focus, not simply on the scientific or explanatory role of certain facts or beliefs, but also on non-explanatory aspects of "intellectual role" -- such as Enoch's interest in "deliberative indispensability".

I'm not unsympathetic to either of these moves. But it is worth noting that the focus on a comparison between morals and mathematics in particular may not be as uncontroversial as the editors sometimes suggest. For example, in the introduction, they write that "values, virtues, obligations, numbers, sets, functions" are not "manifest in perception", nor does "knowledge of them . . . depend on experience." Many metaethicists would accept some version of these claims. But there are others who would insist on a robust role for moral perception within moral epistemology.[2] And those who do may feel that a focus on the analogy between morals and mathematics runs the risk of distorting the nature of moral epistemology.

A similar concern is, of course, a common theme within the sentimentalist tradition in metaethics. For if "morality is more properly felt than judg'd", then it is far from clear that the proper point of comparison in thinking about the nature of moral epistemology is provided by mathematics (Hume, 2000). This concern is particularly striking in the present context, insofar it has become common in recent years to claim that evolutionarily informed psychology supports a sentimentalist approach to moral psychology and epistemology. If something like this is correct, one might worry that evolutionarily informed psychology itself calls into question the centrality of the analogy around which this volume is built.

Still, such concerns should not be overstated. For the interest of the analogy between morals and mathematics only depends on there being some significant respects along which these cases are comparable. And, for reasons I discuss below, this is very plausible. But it is worth stressing that comparative projects in philosophy like this one are seldom philosophically neutral. Indeed, many of the familiar debates in the history of philosophy can be described, at least in part, as debates about which issues in philosophy are truly "comparable".[3]

With that in mind, let me turn to the essays themselves. There is far too much interesting material for me to attempt to summarize it here. Instead, I'll spend the most of the remainder of this review commenting on a line of thought that emerges in the course of first group of essays. But before turning to the topic of debunking, let me highlight one of the interesting upshots of the second set of essays on indispensability. Several of these essays (Leng, Baker, Enoch) focus on Enoch's recent attempt (2011) to develop an argument for "robust moral realism" from deliberative indispensability. A common complaint about Enoch's argument is that the sort of "deliberative indispensability" he focuses on simply isn't capable of generating a genuinely epistemic justification for our metaethical beliefs.[4] Leng and Baker's essays provide an interesting counterpoint to this objection in two ways. First, they help to bring out the broadly pragmatist context in which indispensability arguments about mathematics were first developed -- an orientation that Enoch in some ways sees himself as continuing. And second, they suggest, from the perspective of philosophy of mathematics, that there may be respects in which Enoch's argument is actually more secure than mathematical indispensability arguments. Thus, these essays helpfully complicate the dialectic concerning arguments like Enoch's.

With that in mind, let's turn to the first group of essays on debunking. This group begins with Clarke-Doane's elegant summary of his concerns about evolutionary debunking arguments in metaethics. These concerns center on the claim that he labels "Modal Security":

Modal Security: If information, E, undermines our beliefs of a kind, D, then it does so by giving us reason to doubt that our D-beliefs are either sensitive or safe.

In effect, Modal Security claims that some piece of information can playing an undermining role with respect to some set of beliefs only by showing us at least one of the following:

Insensitive: Had the contents of our these beliefs been false, we would have still believed them.
Unsafe: We could have easily had false beliefs of this kind.[5]

The essential intuition here is the following: if we are confident that neither of these forms of "modal fragility" is present, then we should be confident that our beliefs in this area are generally effective at tracking the relevant facts, at least within nearby modal space. And if we are confident of this, it is unclear why should regard these beliefs as anything but a good guide to these facts.[6]

Clarke-Doane goes on to argue that evolutionary considerations do not suggest that our most basic moral beliefs are either insensitive or unsafe in this sense. According to him, our moral beliefs are not insensitive because they concern metaphysical necessities and so are trivially sensitive (on a standard reading of the relevant counterfactuals). Similarly, with respect to safety, he argues that evolutionary theory actually suggests that we would have tended to developed similar basic moral beliefs across a reasonably broad range of possible environments of selection. Thus, unless we have some further reason to suspect that our basic moral beliefs are false, evolutionary considerations support -- rather than undermine -- the claim that our basic moral beliefs are safe.

Modal Security represents Clarke-Doane's way of making precise ideas that many critics of debunking arguments, including Wielenberg and Enoch, have articulated in some form.[7] But, as several of the contributors note, there is some reason to wonder whether Modal Security is the best way to capture this basic line of thought. For example, Joyce notes that a focus on sensitivity and safety seem is much more compelling in cases involving contingent facts than they are with respect to necessary truths. In particular, sensitivity and safety seem to capture at least some forms of epistemic luck very well in the contingent case. But it is at least unclear that they adequately characterize the analogous forms of epistemic luck in cases involving necessary truths. A number of philosophers have taken this phenomenon to indicate that safety and sensitivity, at least as normally defined, cannot be the whole story in such cases (for example, see Yamada (2011), Setiya (2014).

This provides one reason for caution about Moral Security. But it also faces another worry that raises more general questions about the point of debunking arguments. In particular, as Tersman discusses, Clarke-Doane's account of why our basic moral beliefs are sensitive and safe seems to leave us short of a truly unified or satisfying explanation of why these beliefs track the moral facts. After all, even if it is successful, Clarke-Doane's story tells us at most (i) why the basic moral facts could not have been different, and (ii) why our basic moral beliefs could not have easily been very different. But, as Tersman stresses, these facts only entail that these beliefs are sensitive and safe, on the assumption that our actual moral beliefs are true.

To be clear, the problem here is not that we are not entitled to treat our actual moral beliefs as true in the present dialectical context. For I agree with most of the authors in the section that we should consider the force of potential debunking arguments from a perspective that takes a default, but defeasible, entitlement to trust our moral beliefs or faculties as its starting point. After all, the debunker's task to offer us an argument that defeats such an entitlement, and to consider whether they are successful at this task, we need to consider the force of their arguments within a context in which such a defeasible entitlement is in place. So the worry here is not that this way of proceeding is question-begging against the debunker. In short, my concern here is not that this approach is objectionably circular in an epistemic sense.

Rather, what is worrisome about views like those articulated by Clarke-Doane, Wielenberg, Enoch, and (to be fair) myself, is that they seem to leave us short of a genuinely satisfying explanation of the fact that our moral beliefs track the moral facts. For example, suppose we agree that the fundamental explanation of moral beliefs is naturalistic through-and-through.[8] And suppose that we also accept a form of "robust realism" on which moral facts cannot be reduced to or wholly explained by naturalistic facts. Then, no matter what else we say, in the end our best explanation of why our moral beliefs track the moral facts will rest on the conjunction of (i) a purely naturalistic story about the development of our moral faculties and beliefs and (ii) a distinct moral explanation of why the natural properties these beliefs track are morally significant. I think that even anti-debunkers (like myself) should acknowledge that this sort of explanation bottoms out in what we might regard as a sort "cosmic coincidence" between (i) the basic moral facts and (ii) the naturalistic facts that explain our moral beliefs.[9]

Now, I don't feel that such "coincidences" should be rejected simply as such. Indeed, I believe that our total evidence sometimes makes belief in such a "coincidence" the most rational option.[10] And it may well be that metaethics is one such case. But I also think that such an account would leave us short of a maximally satisfying explanation of the reliability of our moral beliefs. For it is not implausible to regard such explanations as relying on a correlation (between the basic moral facts and the naturalistic facts that are relevant to the explanation of our moral beliefs) that is quite close in the relevant respects to the correlation (between the moral facts and our moral beliefs) that we are trying to explain. In other words, while I don't think such views are objectionably epistemically circular, they may involve a sort of explanatory near-circularity that renders them less than fully satisfying as explanations of the ability of our moral beliefs to track the moral facts. And that may well have a mild debunking effect -- at least insofar as it gives us a reason to prefer metaethical views that provide a more unified or satisfying explanation of our reliability about moral questions.[11] For surely one important task of moral epistemology in general is to offer as satisfying an explanation of this fact as possible.

One response to these worries about Modal Security (and similar accounts) would be to expand our account of knowledge so that knowledge requires more than safety and sensitivity. In the present context, a natural way of doing so would be to claim that moral knowledge requires an appropriate explanatory connection between (say) the fundamental moral facts and our basic moral beliefs. As Kieran Setiya (2014) has recently argued, such an account of knowledge opens the door to a style of debunking argument which is importantly different from those proposed by Sharon Street or Joyce -- and which would not defused by the arguments offered against their arguments. For if such an account of knowledge is correct, then it would seem to rule out knowledge of fundamental moral facts in cases in which (i) these facts cannot be explained in other terms and (ii) the explanation of our moral beliefs makes no reference to any moral facts.

Personally, I remain skeptical of the claims about knowledge on which accounts like Setiya's rest -- which seem to me to go well beyond the requirements implicit in the ordinary conceptual role or function of knowledge ascriptions (see Schafer 2014, forthcoming). As such, my basic sympathies here are with those -- like Clarke-Doane, Enoch, and Wielenberg -- who see many debunking arguments as tacitly resting on dubious epistemological assumptions. And yet, as noted above, I also think that such arguments may have a sort of mild debunking effect. For while I don't think that such arguments provide anything like decisive grounds for moral skepticism -- even on the assumption of "robust moral realism" -- I do think they point to legitimate sources of theoretical dissatisfaction with robust realist views in metaethics.

In this sense, I have some sympathy with Joyce's call in this volume for "modesty" about the potential force of such arguments. But I also think that Joyce himself overstates what such arguments can show. For Joyce, debunking arguments can be seen as shifting the burden of proof onto the moral realist. For reasons already indicated, this seems to me to treat these arguments as stronger than they are. Rather, it seems to me that such arguments at most point to certain real -- but by no means necessarily fatal -- costs of "more robust" forms of moral realism. Acknowledging such costs is important, but to consider whether they give us decisive reason to turn away from "robust realism" we need to consider the overall theoretical virtues of such views when compared with the alternatives. Thus, while debunking arguments can put pressure on more realist views in metaethics, this pressure is not well described in terms of a straightforward shifting of the burden of proof onto the realist. Or it is only well described in this way, if we presuppose a view about the other costs and benefits of moral realism.


Thanks to Sinan Dogramaci and Jack Woods for helpful comments on this review.


Clarke-Doane, Justin. (2012) "Morality and Mathematics: The Evolutionary Challenge," Ethics 122(2): 313-40.

Dogramaci, Sinan. (forthcoming) "Explaining our Moral Reliability," Pacific Philosophical Quarterly.

Enoch, David. (2010) "The Epistemological Challenge to Metanormative Realism: How Best to Understand It, and How to Cope with It," Philosophical Studies 148.3: 413-38.

---- (2011) Taking Morality Seriously. Oxford University Press.

Gill, Michael. (2007) "Moral rationalism vs. moral sentimentalism: Is morality more like math or beauty?" Philosophy Compass 2(1): 16-30.

Hume, David. (2000) A Treatise of Human Nature. David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.), Oxford University Press.

Joyce, Richard. (2006) The Evolution of Morality. MIT Press.

McPherson, Tristram and Plunkett, David. (2015) "Deliberative Indispensability and Epistemic Justification," in Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 10. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford University Press: 104-133.

Schafer, Karl. (2010) "Evolution and Normative Skepticism," Australasian Journal of Philosophy 88(3): 471-488

---- (2013) "Perception and the Rational Force of Desire," Journal of Philosophy 110(5): 258-281.

---- (2014) "Knowledge and Two Faces of Non-Accidental Truth," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 89(2): 373-393.

---- (forthcoming) "Evolutionary Debunking Arguments, Explanatory Structure, and the Motivations for Moral Anti-Realism," in Taking Sentimentalism Seriously, R. Debes and K. Stueber (eds.), Cambridge University Press.

Setiya, Kieran (2014). Knowing Right from Wrong. Oxford University Press.

Street, Sharon. (2006) "A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value," Philosophical Studies 127(1): 109-166.

Vavova, Katia. (2015) "Evolutionary Debunking of Moral Realism," Philosophy Compass 10(2): 104-116.

Wielenberg, Eric. (2010) "On the Evolutionary Debunking of Morality." Ethics 120(3): 441-64.

Woods, Jack. (forthcoming) "Mathematics, Morality, and Self-Effacement," Nous.

Yamada, Masashiro. (2011) "Getting it Right by Accident." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 83(1): 72-105

[1] For two prominent versions of these arguments, see Street (2006) and Joyce (2006). For a different style of debunking argument, see Setiya (2014).

[2] For my preferred account of what such "perception" might involve, on the most basic level, see Schafer (2013). For some skepticism about the perceptual model, see Chapter 2 of Setiya (2014).

[3] For a helpful case study in this phenomenon in the early modern period, see Gill (2007).

For an interesting attempt to compare the moral case with the case of inductive reasoning, see Dogramaci (forthcoming).

[4] McPherson and Plunkett (2015).

[5] I follow Clarke-Doane's formulations here. As he notes, there are many questions about how to best formulate such principles.

[6] As we'll see, these claims are much more controversial than this might suggest. Here recent debates about the significance of safety and sensitivity for the proper analysis of knowledge are, of course, relevant.

[7] For some of the relevant literature, see Wielenberg (2010), Enoch (2010), Schafer (2010), Clarke-Doane (2012), and Vavova (2015). But there are many other articles in this general vein that one might cite here.

Note that these may also be reasons for skepticism about Wielenberg's claim in this volume that, "where there is no contingency, there is no luck" -- at least if we understand luck to be whatever is epistemically problematic about the relevant cases.

[8] To be clear, it is by no means obvious that this assumption is correct.

[9] Compare Street (2006).

[10] See Schafer (2010, forthcoming) for more discussion.

[11] Compare Woods (2016).