Explanatory Pluralism

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C. Mantzavinos, Explanatory Pluralism, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 221pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107128514.

Reviewed by Sharyn Clough, Oregon State University


C. Mantzavinos, an accomplished scholar in the philosophy of social sciences, especially economics, delivers a precise formulation of explanatory activity -- no easy task given that explanatory activity is itself, he argues, imprecise, organic, social, and ongoing. In ten robust chapters sandwiched between a short introduction and epilogue, he argues in support of a change of topic, away from what he takes to be the wrong question (viz., "what is an explanation?") and toward a pluralistic account that views explanation as an action rather than as an outcome.

A brief stylistic note: the footnotes are visually disruptive and rhetorically confusing. Set in tiny subscript, the footnotes are in fact used to articulate substantive portions of the arguments made throughout the book -- they often take up over half the page of text. Enquiring minds might wonder why some (more? all?) of the information in the footnotes was not moved into the main body of the text. Equally satisfying would have been to have the entire book presented as a footnote, to Plato or otherwise, as long as it was in a readable font.


In the second chapter "The Wrong Question: What is an Explanation?" Mantzavinos provides a brief but authoritative accounting of the received view of explanation as it was articulated by Carl Hempel and Paul Oppenheim in the analytic philosophy of science, as well as of the main alternatives to the received view (Wesley Salmon's causal mechanistic model, Philip Kitcher's unification model, the pragmatic account offered by Bas van Fraassen, James Woodward's manipulationalist approach, and finally the "kairetic" account by Michael Strevens that combines the causal and unification approaches).

Mantzavinos argues that, while these alternatives provide helpful antidotes to the problems that beset the received view, they offer variations aimed at answering the question, "what is an explanation?" which he takes to be wrong-headed. He goes on to argue that even if they were aimed at the right question, a further error consists in their underlying presumption that there is a single unitary response that will answer to the many and various needs of a good account of explanation. With respect to this latter point, Mantzavinos uses the third chapter "A Brief Outlook on the Social Sciences" to show that the current explanatory offerings each apply only to a restricted range of scientific activities and therefore fail their own claims of universal scope.

In chapter four "Towards Explanatory Pluralism," Mantzavinos begins his positive account by zeroing in on the reasons that the standard explanatory offerings are insufficient -- they all share an appeal to causality. He notes, however, that our intuitions about causality are often derivative of our understanding of explanation -- that we are unsatisfied with the claim that shadow lengths explain tower heights is because the claim violates our pre-theoretical understanding of the proper ordering of explanatory beliefs (p. 20). Additionally, he reminds us, not all instances of explanation are causal (e.g. mathematical explanations). Finally, appeals to causality are often underwritten by a variety of metaphysical assumptions not always shared by those making the appeals. He wants an account of explanation that does not rely on any particular ontological commitment. For example, he differentiates his pluralistic account from various ontological positions in the debates about reductionism, even when these positions are themselves pluralistic (e.g., John Dupré's promiscuous realism or Nancy Cartwright's dappled world), as these positions are devoted to pluralism with respect to ontology. His account is meant to be free of ontological commitments of any kind. This is primarily a move to allow for an account with more descriptive coverage but he also argues that his account also provides a more compelling normative dimension, a point he addresses later in the book.

Mantzavinos explains in chapter five "The Explanatory Enterprise" that explanation is a social project undertaken by humans everywhere, dedicated to providing answers to "why" questions. Answers to why questions only make sense relative to particular contexts, but they are everywhere governed by rules. Here he introduces the notion of explanatory projects as games with rules. "Different people play different explanatory games which give rise to different outcomes" (p. 35). Explanatory projects are always ongoing, they are always unfinished, they change through time.

Mantzavinos appeals here to the Wittgensteinian notion of games and a Darwinian sensibility regarding the evolutionary processes that govern the rise and fall of different explanations over time and in different contexts. Previous attempts at articulating the nature of explanation treat explanations as static outcomes, he thinks it makes more sense to analyze explanatory activity as a process, as an action rather than as an outcome.

The sixth is the most robust chapter. In "The Rules of the Explanatory Game" he provides a rich and many-layered analysis of the variety of ways that explanatory projects develop, conflict, and coalesce. We get first a finely-detailed characterization of the types of rules at work in any given explanatory activity. Although he uses examples throughout, the first part of this chapter is dedicated to providing an abstract characterization. In the second part of the chapter he moves from his abstract characterization to show how these rules apply in two particular cases drawn from economics and medicine.

With respect to the explanatory rules themselves, he is here precise, and it seems to this reader, exhaustive in his descriptions and formulations. His list of rules includes:

  • constitutive rules, i.e., rules determining what counts as an explanandum, what must be taken as given, and what metaphysical presuppositions are allowed;
  • rules of representation, i.e., rules determining whether the explanation should appeal to linguistic representations, including mathematical expression, or visual representations such as diagrams or pictures. These latter rules are further governed by:
  • rules determining which entities count as representation-bearers,
  • rules determining by virtue of what a representation-bearer is supposed to represent,
  • and rules determining by virtue of what a representation bearer is connected with the representational object (!);
  • rules of inference (more complicated and varied than one might think);
  • and, finally, rules of scope.

Of the last he writes: "Rules of scope comprise the instructions about where to apply the explanatory practices of the game and how to apply the game to new phenomena" (p. 48).

His case study in medicine, particularly his careful history of explanatory games as applied to the vertebrate circulatory system, is an extremely helpful explication of his argument, and a pleasure to read. Mantzavinos begins with the centuries-long reign of Galen, arguing that the rules of the explanatory game that underwrote Galen's work were themselves incredibly robust and long-lasting. The constitutive rules included a clear outline of the explanandum -- the role of the heart in blood circulation -- and a series of metaphysical suppositions concerning the teleological nature of all life, and the notion of pneuma or "life-giving spirit." The rules of representation largely specified direct sensory detection (sight, taste, touch, smell, sound) as these became available during dissection and vivisection. However until the availability of microscopes, direct sensory observation did not lead to accurate descriptions. The rules of inference included those of logic (e.g., consistency) and analogical reasoning, from non-human animals available for dissection and vivisection to humans not usually so available. The rules of scope directed explanatory attention to the cardio-vascular system of course, but also more broadly to include nutrition. Galen described the circulatory process as one of ebb and flow, directionless and slow.

Mantzavinos painstakingly documents how, by thinking of changes in explanation as changes in the rules of an explanatory game, we get a richer account of the centuries-long evolution of medical understanding of the cardio-vascular system that takes us from Galen to William Harvey. One major change in this evolution concerned the rules of inference. Regarding analogic reasoning, Harvey introduced the analogy of the heart as a pump. He also introduced mathematical inferences. He approximated the amount of blood in a chamber of the heart, imagined some smaller amount of that blood being pumped throughout the body with each beat, and multiplied that number by the number of beats in a minute, an hour, a day. By simple arithmetic, he concluded that although they could not see the blood moving from arteries to veins, that the entire system must be connected and a given amount of blood circulated rather than renewed with each beat -- our bodies could not contain the amount of blood renewed with each beat of the heart even over a short period of time. Additionally, the rules of representation began to include rich and relatively accurate diagrams based on more readily available human cadavers. These diagrams made clear the presence of valves in the arteries and veins that allowed the blood to flow in one direction only. The rules of representation also accommodated the introduction of diagrams based on the new technology of microscopy. Finally, the constitutive rules had changed regarding metaphysical suppositions -- no longer was it necessary to postulate life-giving spirits.

In chapter seven, "The Plurality of Explanatory Games," Mantzavinos argues that at any given moment across cultures, within cultures, and even within institutions of any given culture, there can be a plurality of explanatory games concerning roughly the same explananda, but these explanatory games can't necessarily be compared or ranked -- because they don't share the same rules, e.g., they appeal to different constitutive rules regarding metaphysical suppositions. He compares biblical and scientific explanations for the origin of the universe in these terms. He also shows that across time, a plurality of explanatory games exists, as for example with his discussion of the dynamic development of explanatory games regarding the cardio-vascular system. He notes that even what counts as an appropriate explanandum in a given domain can evolve over time -- the things about which one can legitimately ask "why"? shift over time. He notes that his model of explanatory games is neutral with respect to philosophical accounts of how certain phenomena are identified as legitimate topics of debate and others simply to be assumed as given. Thomas Kuhn's theory of paradigms is one account. But as with evolution in biology, in the evolution of explanatory games we can't specify ahead of time which phenomenon will demand an explanation and which won't.

I have not said much here about what he takes to be the normative implications of his descriptive case -- mostly because I'm not convinced that the distinction does much work here. But Mantzavinos thinks the descriptive/normative distinction is important and robust and reorients his book in the last chapters (8-11) in a self-consciously normative direction. Much of the eleventh chapter "Explanatory Methodology as Technology" presents a (properly) fallibilistic approach to normative judgements of progress or success vis-à-vis explanatory activity. I think here the persuasiveness of what he calls the descriptive side of his project bleeds into normative issues of what a good explanatory process might look like. For example, he argues that, as explainers of the nature of competing explanatory activities, we philosophers will do better the more we attend to potential mismatches in adherence to the rules of the explanatory games being played, recognizing that these rules often change depending on the goals of any given explanatory activity. Our philosophical judgements of progress or success are interwoven with our progress and success in getting these descriptive details right.

Of the many valuable features of this book that I have highlighted, I particularly appreciate the painstaking work that Mantzavinos puts into making explicit the largely implicit rules we all follow when we participate in the game of providing an explanation. So much that is usually taken for granted is spelled out here. And once the details are brought to light it is hard to resist his conclusion: explanation is best seen as a multi-layered activity, rather than a static product.