Explorations in Ancient and Modern Philosophy, Volumes 1-2

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M. F. Burnyeat, Explorations in Ancient and Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2012, Volume 1, 382pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521750721, Volume 2, 356pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521750738.

Reviewed by Rachel Barney, University of Toronto


The only thing historians of ancient philosophy really need to know about these volumes is that they exist. Burnyeat is a dominant figure in the field, a model for generations of scholars: for most of us, the publication of these papers represents a welcome chance to upgrade from a huge folder of mangy photocopies. The only problem is that many of these will be too heavily annotated to throw out; but with clean copies we can at least begin the process of being enlightened, inspired, and provoked all over again.

The papers included here date from 1964-96, the period during which Burnyeat taught first at University College London and then at Cambridge, including twelve years as Laurence Professor. They are divided into two volumes, each in turn divided into two parts: 'Logic and Dialectic' and 'Scepticism Ancient and Modern' constitute volume 1, 'Knowledge' and 'Philosophy and the Good Life', volume 2. These parts are of very roughly equal weight; but the last, notwithstanding the presence of the very influential 'Virtues in action' and 'Aristotle on learning to be good', is not wholly devoted to ethics. More of a catchall, it also includes papers on Heraclitus and on the opening words of Platonic dialogues, as well as Burnyeat's classic debunking of Straussianism. Not quite everything one might have hoped for is here; in particular, two Aristotle papers are missing which, notoriously, spawned a frenzied debate while still circulating in typescript: 'Is an Aristotelian philosophy of mind still credible? (a draft)', and 'How much happens when Aristotle sees red and hears middle C? Remarks on De Anima, 2. 7-8'. (Both are available in the updated version of M.C. Nussbaum, and A.O Rorty,. (eds.), Essays on Aristotle's De Anima (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1995); Burnyeat would presumably prefer to refer us to 'De Anima II 5' (Phronesis (47) 2002, 28-90), which falls outside the chronological scope of the present volumes.) Some may also feel a pang for 'The Material and Sources of Plato's Dream' (Phronesis (15) 1970, 101-22) (presumably superseded by his epic 'Introduction' to the Levett translation of the Theaetetus (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1990)). But all the other important articles seem to be here, and almost any reader will also discover something new. There are no revisions or significant introductory material, but neither does one feel the need for any. The production is handsome, and I have noticed only two really disorienting typos (a missing (1), I assume, on vol. 1, 57, and "by imagine" cannot be right on vol. 2, 310).

Non-specialists who want to see what the fuss is about would do well to dive into some of the characteristic blockbuster papers here on scepticism or Greek epistemology: 'Protagoras and self-refutation in Plato's Theaetetus', 'Can the sceptic live his scepticism?', 'Enthymeme: Aristotle on the logic of persuasion', 'Idealism and Greek philosophy: what Descartes saw and Berkeley missed', or 'The Sceptic in his place and time'. Seen together, these papers display some common patterns. The discussion is organized around a single, thorny philosophical puzzle, and the stakes are always high. Can Pyrrhonian scepticism work at all? Does Plato succeed in refuting relativism? Is idealism even a live option in Greek philosophy? The path to an answer is always rich, detailed, and complex, a fascinating tour through texts both central and obscure. Burnyeat moves effortlessly from minute questions of philological detail -- a point about variant mss or lexicography -- to large-scale philosophical argument; from rigorous textual analysis to comparisons with Wittgenstein, Gassendi or Hume. These forces are mustered with sweep and panache: there is real literary skill here, and it is used above all to convey the fun and excitement of the intellectual detective work. The smaller-scale papers tend to start from an unrecognised or misunderstood oddity in some short but crucial stretch of text, and to focus on first eliciting, then resolving aporiai which point well beyond it.

Thus if there is a single most characteristic move here, we might call it the 'William Blake': the ability to see the world in the grain of sand, the macrocosmic philosophical stakes in the inconspicuous point of textual detail -- even, as in a case I will discuss below, a question of punctuation. (As a result, the Greekless/Latinless reader will usually be able to grasp the broad trajectory of the argument, but will be in a poor position to assess it in any detail.) Note 22 to 'Idealism and Greek philosophy' offers, as a response to a possible objection, a new reading of Parmenides B8.38, based on accepting the oft-emended mss reading and reconstruing its grammar (n. 22, vol. 1, 257-8). This footnote on a single line, in a paper about something else, has probably had more influence on recent readings of Parmenides than any number of whole articles.

So you always learn more than you bargained for with a Burnyeat paper. For one thing, there is a great deal here about modern figures like Russell, Moore, and Wittgenstein; and also about early modern philosophy, and its wide-ranging, often surprising, uses of ancient texts. (Burnyeat has been a pioneer and an inspiration here: ancient-early modern crossover work is now a burgeoning field.) There are also points of detail worth remembering, and not just about manuscript readings and Parmenidean syntax. Burnyeat is the person who -- after centuries of blithe philosophical example-mongering -- actually checked, and discovered that no, people with jaundice do not see things as yellow ('Conflicting Appearances', vol. 1, 288).

The upshot of these papers is, in many cases, not just a reading of some position or argument. The longer ones mostly tell narratives, of how some idea or line of argument was first devised, elaborated, refuted, transformed, and ultimately misremembered or forgotten altogether. We end up with a different story about some large area of the field -- and usually a more interesting, philosophically impressive one -- than whatever standard line we assumed at the outset. "If a philosophical argument is worth attention, so is its history": so begins the first chapter of the first volume ('Protagoras and self-refutation in later Greek philosophy', vol. 1, 3).

A number of the major articles here have spawned whole literatures, which I cannot hope to advance or even summarize here. Instead I will briefly discuss four short papers (each under 20 pages), one from each of the four sections. This should at least give a sense of how the range and virtues of Burnyeat's work play out on the smaller scale.

'Tranquillity without a stop: Timon, frag. 68' is a good instance of the 'William Blake'. It concerns a small question, namely whether line three of the fragment in question should end with a comma, and also a very large one: whether Pyrrho and his follower Timon should be read as advocating a substantive ethical agenda. (The answer to the first question is No: as with a number of the papers here, the title turns out to be an elegant joke.) The fragment seems to report a somewhat obscure pronouncement of Pyrrho's, in Timon's Indalmoi, in which he claims a 'correct yardstick of truth' as to 'the nature [phusis] of the divine and the good'. But this could only be a gross piece of dogmatism; and our other evidence shows Timon's Pyrrho to have held, like later sceptics, that nothing is good or bad by nature. The solution, Burnyeat argues, is to remove the editors' comma, and supply an 'is' of identity rather than an existential one, reading: "The nature of the divine and the good <is> at any time that from which a man's life becomes most equable" (239). The advantage is that "'the divine' and 'the good' no longer designate an independent and eternally existing phusis" (239). (I do not really follow Burnyeat's further insistence that we should take Pyrrho as in some sense talking about himself (239, 240).) Pyrrho's pronouncement emerges as a deflationary, underspecified sort of definition: the divine good is just whatever renders a human life tranquil. Plausibly putting together fragment 68D with 71D, Burnyeat sees Timon's Pyrrho as arguing that, as nothing is really bad or good, "desire is bad, its absence good -- how can this fail to be so if there is no value in the fulfilment of desire because there is nothing of value to fulfil it?" (241). (Burnyeat is a bit quick, incidentally, in taking this to be a good argument.) The upshot is that "one desire stands unconditioned and uncondemned, the desire for happiness or tranquillity; this could be thought of as a higher-order desire common to all men for a satisfactory life free from pain and disturbance" (242-3).

The resulting picture of Timon and Pyrrho is perhaps still problematically dogmatic, but there is no denying that this flirtation with a kind of metalevel ethical doctrine continues in later Pyrrhonism, so that at least Pyrrho and Timon are no longer a special problem case; it also, as Burnyeat notes, dovetails nicely with Cicero's testimony that Pyrrho recognised apatheia as the sole good. As for its plausibility as a reading of the fragment, though, this is one case where it is frustrating not to have Burnyeat's later thoughts, in light of more recent work on Timon (cf. D. Clayman, Timon of Phlius (Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 2009), and R. Bett, Pyrrho: His Antecedents and His Legacy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2000)). One thing that now seems clear is that Timon's mode of presentation is so fully saturated with literary gamesmanship, and Parmenidean-Homeric parody in particular, that it is dangerous to pronounce on the import of any lines in the absence of an overview of his approach. (There is now even a parallel in Posidippus for the 'correct yardstick of truth', where -- very nicely for Burnyeat's purposes -- it might just mean fidelity to the appearances, cf. Clayman, 62-5.) Whether fr. 68D is even Pyrrho speaking is up for grabs (both Bett and Clayman have their doubts), and whoever it is, the speaker is striking a pose as Parmenides' goddess. That might suggest that any amount of dogmatism is dismissible as just so much fancy dress; a central question must be whether Pyrrho could play the role of goddess (and perhaps charioteer as well, cf. 67.6-7D) while also being presented, quite funnily, as an immobile and equable Parmenidean Being.

'The upside-down back-to-front sceptic of Lucretius IV.472' also deals with scepticism, though here from the side of its critics. At issue, again, is the correct translation of a single line, in which Lucretius expresses the standard charge of self-refutation by depicting the sceptic as . . . well, what peculiar position has the sceptic landed in here? Burnyeat reaches back to Gronovius 1662 for a correct understanding: the sceptic has fallen forward (not very far forward, evidently) and now stands on his head in his own footsteps, facing backwards. (Burnyeat often likes to note that some difficult point has been got right by an obscure early scholar or critic, and mishandled ever since. He clearly agrees with Jacques Brunschwig's dictum: "il peut y avoir un progrès" in the study of ancient philosophy, "mais à condition que l'on ne présuppose pas que ce progrès soit linéaire".) The explanation for the grotesque imagery is simple: the image is imported from Epicurus, and more generally from the use of peritrepein for self-refutation: "the peculiarity of Epicurus' variant verb perikatô trepein is that it combines the two images of reversal and turning upside-down" (vol. 1, 53). Epicureans like to charge their opponents with self-refutation: Epicurus speaks of an argument for determinism as turning upside-down, and Philodemus reports the same charge against the Stoic denial of inductive inference. As Burnyeat clearly brings out, in each case the self-refutation in question is dialectical (we could also say, more generally, pragmatic), a matter of having to withdraw one's thesis or fall silent once its presuppositions or implications are drawn out. The determinist holds his opponent responsible for his mistaken views in argument; the Stoic arguments against inductive inference in fact rely on inductive inference. Burnyeat's case here is convincingly made, though the image remains unsatisfying in that it initially suggests, to me at any rate, an impressive bit of acrobatics rather than a mishap. Perhaps it would help (and it would certainly have been interesting) to have had more discussion of how peritropê imagery might relate to the other athletic, acrobatic and agonistic imagery in early dialectical contexts, including the language of wrestling throws associated with Protagoras. (Alas, though his skills would seem ideally suited to much-needed detective work on the subject, Burnyeat seems never to have had much interest in the sophists, apart from Protagoras as Plato and the later tradition present him: the least interesting piece in the whole collection is a brief, dismissive article on the Dissoi Logoi.)

'Socrates and the jury: paradoxes in Plato's distinction between knowledge and true belief' (vol. 2, 99-114) focusses on the very brief, almost cavalier-looking refutation with which Socrates in the Theaetetus finally disposes of the definition of knowledge as true belief: just consider the counterexample of a jury, who, if they reach a correct verdict on the basis of testimony, count as having true belief but not knowledge. As Burnyeat notes, the passage is "packed with paradox" (99). The first difficulty is one that readers and interpreters tend to blithely pass over (as does Socrates himself), namely that Theaetetus claims that everything resulting from a true belief is admirable and good, which is obviously false taken au pied de la lettre. Here Burnyeat explains that Plato is thinking back to the Meno and its far more restricted endorsement of true beliefs about the use of potential goods, or perhaps (there is a bit of unclarity here) about what is the right thing to do. (I wonder if there might not be some more general, if obscure Platonic principle about causality at work here, such that a false ethical belief can always be fingered as the cause [aitia] of a wrong action.) The second paradox is a bigger and more widely recognised problem. Socrates seems to claim that the jury are limited to true opinion for two cross-cutting reasons: "first because what they experience is persuasion rather than teaching, and second because they are not eyewitnesses but dependent on testimony" (102). (Incidentally this is not the only notorious locus where Plato seems to offer one sufficient condition too many: it might be worth comparing the Gorgias' two reasons why rhetoric is merely a knack, and the Republic's two criteria for the identity of dunameis.) This second contrast implies that the first is otiose: no amount of 'teaching' could put the jury in a position to know. Burnyeat accordingly calls for biting the bullet: Plato does not mean to allow that even the well-founded beliefs of a thoroughly instructed jury would add up to knowledge. This at least meshes nicely with the Theaetetus' complete lack of interest in any conception of knowledge as justified true belief.

The third paradox is by far the most important: Socrates' un-Platonic-sounding claim that an eyewitness can have knowledge, with its "apparent admission of the possibility of knowing mundane empirical facts" (107) -- the admission, indeed, of some range of facts that only an eyewitness can claim to know. Burnyeat carefully draws out the implications: Plato seems to advocate a radical rejection of the transmission of knowledge. This violates some of our usual assumptions about the conditions for knowledge; but it seems true enough of understanding, and many pieces of the Platonic puzzle fall into place when we see that the epistêmê he is concerned with is something closer to understanding than to knowledge (as the latter is now usually conceived, by philosophers at any rate). Hence, for instance, the Meno's demand for a worked-out explanation [aitias logismos]; hence Plato's emphasis on the need for definitions, and on clarity as criterial; and hence the focus of Part III of the Theaetetus on the ability to give an account (where it is clear that this is an explanation, not a justification or a marker of certainty). As a resolution of his third paradox this a bit unsatisfying, since it suggests that the perceptual case, where nothing resembling understanding seems to the point, is a terrible model for Platonic epistêmê. Burnyeat is instantly dismissive of the suggestion that Plato is operating with any conception of 'knowledge by acquaintance' or of knowledge as essentially quasi-perceptual; but whatever one's frustrations with earlier interpretations along these lines it is hard not to suspect that Plato needs something of the sort. Otherwise his favourite paradigm of visual perception will simply fail to be paradigmatic of anything. Be that as it may, Burnyeat's positive results here are crucial for the broader understanding of Plato's epistemology, and Aristotle's as well. Indeed, that understanding is at the core of Platonic and Aristotelian 'knowledge' seems obvious today, or as close to obvious as anything in the field gets; not least, I suppose, because of this very paper and its more ambitious and better-known counterpart, 'Aristotle on understanding knowledge' (vol. 2, ch. 6).

'First words' concludes the second volume (vol. 2, 305-26). It is like several of the pieces in this section in bearing, enjoyably, the marks of the occasion for which it was written: a 'Valedictory Lecture', offered as recompense for a never-delivered Inaugural Lecture for the Laurence Professorship at Cambridge. ('The Impiety of Socrates', delivered inter alia at a colloquium in Geneva in honour of George Steiner, even includes stage directions: two votes on the guilt or innocence of Socrates, engineered for dramatically different results.) Offered in a spirit of paidia and enlivened with quasi-personal remarks and Cambridgeana, we have here a serious argument about how to read the openings of Platonic dialogues. Proclus had the right idea (not, as Burnyeat notes, a sentiment commonly heard when he first began work at Cambridge): the dramatic prologues of Platonic dialogues are not just window-dressing but introduce the central philosophical themes to come -- as suggestive images or reflections, though, not by a programmatic encapsulation. This means that they are only to be fully grasped in retrospect, on a second reading. Burnyeat offers as a limited sample and test some observations on the opening of the Republic, in particular the oft-noted resonance between the very first word, katebên, and the return to the Cave in Book VII. (I wonder though whether Plato really has in view a precise analogy between Socrates and the returning philosopher-ruler, as opposed to intending to flag the whole discussion as itself a kind of katabasis -- another deployment of his frequent motif of our world as underworld, one which could well be visible even on a first reading given Gorgias 493a, Meno 99e-100a, and Phaedo 109aff.) He also finds some plausible connections between opening words and philosophical themes in the case of the Laws, Phaedo, Gorgias, Cratylus, Meno, and the deliberately enigmatic Timaeus.

These brief samples should be sufficient to suggest what the longer papers display in full: Burnyeat is ho dialektikos, the master dialectician of his field. That does not mean, of course, that he is always right, but everything he writes is worth repeated reading -- indeed it is only on repeated reading that you are likely to be able to detect openings for dissent. These papers add up to a portrait of the study of ancient philosophy at its best during an exciting period, one marked by a dramatically expanded corpus of study and ever more sophisticated bids to bring ancient and modern ideas into philosophical dialogue.