Exploring Happiness: From Aristotle to Brain Science

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Sissela Bok, Exploring Happiness: From Aristotle to Brain Science, Yale University Press, 2010, 218pp., $24.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300139297.

Reviewed by Owen Flanagan, Duke University


In her very smart, sensitive, and thought-provoking new book, Exploring Happiness, Sissela Bok notices rightly that our time, the early twenty-first century, is seeing a surge of interest and writing, both popular and academic, on happiness. “Positive psychology” is a rage in psychology, and many philosophers, including this reviewer, are all on about how Greek conceptions of eudaimonia — flourishing, fulfillment, well-being — can shed light on contemporary understanding of the good life, of how best to be and to live, on whether and how a sense of meaning, accomplishment, significance, and worthwhileness are to be gained and sustained. There may be no time since the sixth and fifth centuries BC, when Confucius, Buddha, Lao-Tse and Socrates addressed the questions, “What is true happiness and how is it to be attained?”, when so much attention has been paid to the nature of true happiness and how to achieve it, at least as true happiness might be conceived from something like a secular perspective.

Bok’s aim is twofold: first, to set the “striking new findings of natural and social scientists” relevant to the nature and attainment of happiness into conversation with the great thinkers of the past — philosophers, poets, historians, and religious thinkers — to see what, if anything, illuminating on the topic of true happiness emerges; second, to address the connection between the quest for happiness — a seemingly personal or close intrapersonal quest involving me or me and my loved ones — and morality, which if it involves happiness at all, involves a seemingly wider happiness than that of me and my small circle of loved ones.

The book consists of nine chapters, which I briefly summarize.

In chapter 1, Bok uses her own good fortune at being born to bring into view the remarkableness of the fact that any of us exist at all and the opportunity that this fact affords to attempt to achieve something good for ourselves, something like true happiness or well-being. The inquiry into the causes and conditions of happiness is not elitist because, according to empirical surveys, even poor people, many in poor countries, seek happiness and claim to find it.

Chapter 2, “Experience,” takes up the question of what happiness seems like first-personally, phenomenologically, subjectively. How do terms like ‘happiness,’ ‘bliss’, ‘elation,’ and ‘joy’ interconnect? Bok does a remarkable job bringing into conversation Theresa of Avila, Nabokov, Thoreau, Montaigne, Desmond Tutu, Rousseau, Frederick Douglas, William James, and Charles Darwin, all somehow interwoven with a smart discussion of Nozick’s “Experience Machine” and what it shows or fails to show about what humans want subjectively from life. Richard Rorty had a knack for weaving famous names together to create some semblance of a conversation across time and space, but Bok is even better at actually getting the conversation to happen, by brilliant selection of quotes and brief, clear commentary of their meaning and significance. The overall effect, if not the exact aim of this chapter, is to make one think that there are a variety of experiences, most of them seemingly worthy and very pleasant, that fall under the superordinate concept of happiness.

Chapter 3, “Discordant Definitions,” continues the work of the previous chapter, but moves from discussion of experiences of happiness to actual attempts to define, state, and systematize its nature. Alexander Pope’s poem from 1733, “An Essay on Man,” expresses a common skepticism that when smart people try to define the concept of happiness, they end up in a sort of circular mumbling, “happiness is happiness.” Bok is not so skeptical that reflection on something like definitions — they seem more like analyses — from Aristotle, Plato, Seneca, Josiah Royce, John Rawls, and various contemporary philosophers and mind scientists can put us in a position to reflect on the nature of true happiness, if, that is, it has a nature, a common core beneath the differences of experiences and conceptions explored in the previous chapter. It is in this chapter that Bok introduces the reader to Kant’s famous challenge to those who think that happiness is very important, the summum bonum. To be happy is one thing and to be good is another. Sometimes the two quests are orthogonal to one another. Sometimes they conflict. When they do conflict, we want to know which is trump. Kierkegaard, who is not mentioned in the book, gave an interesting but what many think is a disturbing answer: in cases of conflict between the happiness seeking life and the ethical life (or versions of each), there is no answer about which is trump that doesn’t antecedently privilege the way of being, the form of life that is eventually favored in answering the question. The great Bernard Williams is used by Bok to channel the worry that at some points in every human life, the ends of happiness and morality will conflict with no non-question begging way to resolve such conflicts.

The next chapter, “On the Happy Life,” is a meditation first on Seneca’s influential stoic view that happiness requires “a simple, pared-down life in pursuit of wisdom and virtue.” Here we are introduced to some recent confirmation of the pared-down view which shows that subjective well being (SWB) does not increase once one is above a certain threshold, say the equivalent of 60K US for a family of four. This, of course, isn’t really confirmation since Seneca’s view is that a pared-down life is necessary for true happiness, so we’d need to be shown that rich folk are not happy. But the work in neuroeconomics does seem to confirm that money — above the threshold — is not necessary for happiness. The chapter weaves the Seneca thread through Cicero, Augustine, Boethius, Aquinas, Pascal, Descartes, Princess Elizabeth, La Mettrie, and Diderot and brings sharply into relief the centuries-long debate over whether happiness is possible in this world (Seneca) or whether it was only possible in another life (Augustine). One feels in revisiting these classical texts that we still live inside that dialectical space in North America today.

Chapter 5, “Measurement,” takes up the hope, familiar to philosophers from Jeremy Bentham’s “felicific calculus,” that happiness might somehow be measured. Besides Bentham, we meet, of course, his protégé John Stuart Mill, who proposed a way to evaluate, if not exactly measure, which among two goods was better, more productive of true happiness, qualitatively superior even if quantitatively less intense, by returning to the Aristotelian idea of the person with expertise or wisdom in evaluating what really or ideally produces pleasure and happiness. Then, in one of the many unexpected tasty morsels we meet Francis Edgeworth, who in 1881 invented the fantasy of a “hedonimeter”: a theoretical device that would one day measure units of happiness and realize the dream of evaluating something like how happy an individual is. Voila, the twenty-first century and we meet modern day psychologists and neuroscientists who use various surveys and brain measurements to do exactly that. Bok gives a fair and charitable introduction to the work on subjective well-being measures — roughly how happy a person self-evaluates — and objective well-being measures (sometimes rightly called “eudaimonistic well-being” — EWB) which appeal to an external standard, such as how leftward the prefrontal cortex lights up or how well the agent does on a Nussbaum-Sen measure of goods needed for flourishing, such things as potable water, good health, marriage.

Chapter 6, “Beyond Temperament,” discusses the very interesting question of whether there are different temperamental types that are “organically weighted,” as William James put it, which load the dice one way or another for how likely true happiness might be. Recent research shows that extroverts are more likely to have some kinds of positive experiences than introverts. This matters only if these kinds of positive experiences are relevant to — especially if they are common causes of or constituents of — true happiness. If extroverts have more sex, drugs, and rock n’ roll in their lives than introverts, then we might well judge them worse off, not better off when it comes to prospects of true happiness. The chapter is a sensitive exploration of this possibility as well as related complications: whether happiness requires love and friendship or might be had in solitude, and the worrisome connection between creativity and melancholia, even madness in some cases.

Chapter 7, “Is Lasting Happiness Possible,” is set up around the opposing claims published in 1930: by Freud that happiness is not possible and by Bertrand Russell that it is possible. Both took it that most people are not happy in fact. But Russell had a picture of a happy person who

feels himself a citizen of the universe, enjoying freely the spectacle that it offers and the joys that it affords, untroubled by the thought of death because he feels himself not entirely separate from those who will come after him. It is in such profound instinctive union with the stream of life that the greatest joy is to be found.

And he thought a combination of right thinking about things plus some attitude adjusting to conform desire to the nature of things could help one make oneself such a “happy person.” Bok uses this debate to introduce us to recent research on happiness set points — dispositional characteristics, which are, on most views, connected to subjective happiness (but maybe not to happiness understood objectively, as “true happiness”) — as well as to the research on “adaptation” and the “hedonic treadmill,” where there are robust findings that people who suffer great losses or gains return after a relatively short time (six weeks) to what seems to be their hedonic set point. Occasionally in this chapter and its predecessor I wished that Bok marked more clearly the distinction that she is sensitive to in most places between subjective and objective measures of happiness.

Chapter 8, “Illusion,” takes up the important question of Socrates and the pig, whether ignorance is bliss. Most philosophers — perhaps it is a constitutional hazard — say ignorance is bad and any bliss it brings is not a component of true happiness. But many thinkers have defended living in the comfort of illusions if necessary for happiness. Here Bok’s spokesperson for the view is the brilliant scientist-philosopher Emily du Chatelet (who left her family for Voltaire), who defended such a life for herself. The chapter interweaves Madame du Chatelet’s defense of a life lived in the comfort of false beliefs and idle hopes with the psychological literature on positive illusions. According to the findings, most people harbor false beliefs about the probabilities of good things (high) or bad things (low) happening to them. Realists are normally moderately depressed and nice people generally score well on having many false self-serving beliefs about themselves and those they love.

The final chapter, “The Scope of Happiness,” expresses well-deserved satisfaction that she has provided a thoughtful journey through some of the best thinking, classical and contemporary, on the nature, meaning, and prospects for true happiness. Bok is a humble, sensitive, perceptive, wise guide to the discussion. What is the right view on what true happiness is and where I get it or find it? Bok does not think there is a single answer. That said, this thoughtful, beautifully written book makes one feel one is present, conversing with the very best minds of the last 2500 years on one of the few philosophical problems that is of universal importance.