Exploring the World of Human Practice: Readings in and about the Philosophy of Aurel Kolnai

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Zoltan Balázs and Francis Dunlop (eds.), Exploring the World of Human Practice: Readings in and about the Philosophy of Aurel Kolnai, Central European University Press, 2005, 343pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9637326014.

Reviewed by Brian Klug, St. Benet's Hall, Oxford


Aurel Kolnai was born in Budapest in 1900 and died in London in 1973. This collection has its origins in the first international conference devoted to Kolnai's work, which was held at the Central European University in the city -- and centenary -- of his birth.

In their Preface, the editors Zoltán Balázs and Francis Dunlop comment that 'in ethics and political philosophy, there are few more remarkable thinkers in the twentieth century' than Kolnai (p. vii). Yet John Beach's observation in 1981 probably still stands: 'Apart from those who knew him personally, it is doubtful that many attribute to Aurel Kolnai the importance that the penetration and fineness of his thought merited' (p. 167). This volume is intended to help remedy the neglect. As an introduction to Kolnai's philosophy it is, as the editors say, 'the first of its kind' (p. vii); for it is actually two collections in one. Part I, 'Papers by Kolnai,' contains eight representative pieces that span the period 1933 to 1970. In part II, 'Papers about Kolnai's Work', thirteen contemporary thinkers each contribute an essay that discusses some aspect or other of his multi-faceted work in (broadly speaking) the philosophy of practice. Given the degree of fineness of Kolnai's thought and the multiplicity of his penetrating insights, this approach -- a combination of readings in and about his philosophy -- is an effective way of introducing the reader to his corpus. In this review, taking my cue from the aim of the book, I shall focus on Kolnai's thought, rather than discussing the papers in part II in their own right.

In a clear and useful Introduction, Dunlop summarizes the main events of Kolnai's life, describes his approach to philosophy, and outlines the contents of the book. He explains that the Kolnai selections in part I 'were chosen to exhibit the range of his characteristic concerns, with a bias towards papers little known or unknown' (p. 9). Two papers have been translated into English especially for this volume. Three others have not previously been published, the earliest of which ('The Concept of Practical Error', 1959) is a good portal through which to enter the realm of Kolnai's philosophy. Certainly, the distinction (but also connections) between morality and practice (in a narrower sense of 'practice' than the sense in which the word is used in the book's title) is a major focus of this paper and a topic that he visits frequently in his writings. He puts the difference sharply: 'The formal theme of practice (the management of my concerns) and the formal theme of morality (submission to a specified set of demands on me, conceived in universal terms) are clearly quite different … ' (p. 105). That the latter cannot be reduced to the former is something he insists on time and again; it is central to his critique of Aristotle's ethics and also to his general political philosophy (a point to which I shall return). At the same time, while the 'themes' are formally distinct, the interactions between them are complex. (In 'A Note on the Meaning of Right and Wrong' (1955) he calls the relation between morality and practice 'dialogic' (p. 55).) This complexity invites exploration; and one of the merits of this volume is that it enables the reader to do just that. To adapt a phrase from Wittgenstein's preface to the Philosophical Investigations, 'the same or almost the same points' are approached afresh from different directions, sometimes unexpectedly, so that the twenty-one papers are like crisscrossing paths in 'the world of human practice'.

To facilitate this exploration, the papers in part II are conveniently grouped into four batches. Lee Congdon's 'Kolnai's Mature Political Philosophy' and John Beach's 'The Ethical Theories of Aurel Kolnai' are 'Introductory'. The remaining eleven papers fall under 'Politics and Utopia' (four), 'Ethics' (four), and 'Feeling and Emotion' (three). Only five of the papers in part II have been published before (of which John Hittinger's 'The Democratic Subversion of Political Liberty and Participation' was extensively rewritten and abbreviated for this volume). Readers, however, should not expect to find a tight fit between the two parts of the book: other than 'Erroneous Conscience' (1957), none of the Kolnai selections in part I are cited in the papers in part II. But given the way Kolnai's mind works -- going over the same ground again and again from different angles -- this is not a drawback, especially for a book that aims to give the broadest possible overview of its subject. The editors, moreover, assist the reader with a list of all of Kolnai's works (and collections of his works) that are cited in the book. (This is in an index for 'Aurel Kolnai' that is in addition to separate indices for names and subjects.) Thus, the assiduous reader is well equipped to investigate further in Kolnai's oeuvre.

Kolnai was no armchair philosopher and his interest in philosophy was not academic. Indeed, he 'never regarded himself as an "academic" in the modern sense' (p. 1), if this means a professional teacher of, and researcher into, a specialized field of enquiry. After graduating in 1926 from Vienna University, where he was drawn to phenomenology, he took the decision to pursue a career in political journalism rather than seek a university post. Not that he abandoned academia altogether. Two years after graduating, he spent a term at Freiburg, studying under Husserl just prior to the latter's retirement. After the Second World War (which left him and his wife Elisabeth, both of Jewish birth, stateless refugees), he was hired by the Catholic University of Laval in Quebec, where he became a fulltime 'professeur'. However, within ten years he had resigned; and at no other time did he hold a fulltime university position (pp. 3-4). In London, where he moved in 1955, he taught part-time at Bedford College, London University, which is where, as a graduate student under his supervision, I knew him from 1971 until his death in 1973.

One reason I valued studying with him is that Kolnai was, at the time, that rare animal: a philosopher who bridged the 'analytic-Continental divide'. Dunlop refers to his 'natural phenomenological method' (p. 6). But, alluding to the later Husserl's transcendental idealism, he clarifies in a footnote that this was 'poles apart from Husserl's obsession with "constitution" …' (p. 13). In this connection, Husserl's judgement on Kolnai in 1928 is revealing: 'You still have a long way to go, Mr Kolnai: you can do description well, but you are as yet far from being a phenomenologist' (p. 278). Kolnai was never to be a phenomenologist of the (later) Husserlian stripe. Moreover, description, of a certain kind, was precisely his conception of the phenomenological method. He explained, 'Subtlety, deep introspective analysis, and passionate concern about cautious distinctions are the forte of phenomenology'.1 Partly for this reason, and partly because of the emphasis he placed on 'common sense' and the commonplace, British philosophy was very much his cup of tea. 'In some respects,' he explained, 'phenomenology presents striking analogies with Moore, with the later Wittgenstein, and with linguistic analysis …'.2 This sympathy is evident in some of the selections in part I of this volume, where his writing sometimes seems tortured by the striving for 'cautious distinctions'. Not every reader will savour Kolnai's style: the 'fastidious use of language' (p. 8), parenthetical remarks, subordinate clauses, and so on. But if at times obscure, he is never obscurantist; just painfully (but often playfully) seeking to make things clear. 'Kolnai is difficult' admits Dunlop (p. 8). But 'philosophy is difficult' avers Kolnai (p. 145). Which brings me to his passion for philosophy.

For Kolnai, philosophy was less a way of making a living and more a way of approaching life. As Dunlop says, he saw philosophy as 'far too important to be counted merely as a "subject" taught in educational institutions' (p. 2). The degree and kind of importance that it had for Kolnai can be gauged by what he says about it in 'The Indispensability of Philosophy' (1947), the last entry in Part I of the book. Some readers might prefer to read it first; it is, in a way, the key to every other door into Kolnai's work. It begins with an assertion and a simile: 'Man needs philosophy because he cannot stop thinking, just as the art of cooking is indispensable because he cannot do without food' (p. 143). (Which is not to deny that there is food that we can do without.) The simile is intended to make the point that philosophy is not a luxury, the neglect of which would result in 'a simple, practical life' (p. 143). Such a life, for a human being, is an ignis fatuus. For although not all thought is philosophical (p. 143), the exigencies of practical life -- or the contingency that we have such a life -- necessitate thinking which in turn necessitates philosophy. His point is not that philosophy is instrumental; his whole temper is opposed to that idea. As Dunlop puts it, 'He saw himself as a philosopher, primarily concerned with truth, not with any useful or even noble extra-philosophical end the truth might serve … ' (p. 7). The point is that practical questions lead to fundamental ones. He poses a slew of questions that are 'purely philosophical' but which 'arise not from the brains of philosophers with nothing much to do, but from the lives of men as such because they have many other things to do … and because they find themselves overcome with remorse after doing them, suffer misfortunes or are afflicted with troubles' (p. 144). The world of human practice -- of human passions -- is his oyster. And, as a philosopher, his passion was for living a truthful life.

In his writings, this passion takes the form of persistently submitting to an imperative that he regarded as universal: 'the imperative need man feels to justify his conduct and beliefs in objective terms' (p. 151). ('Passionate objectivity' was the phrase used to describe him by a certain Francis Ibrányi (p. 4).) This circles back to the distinction that Kolnai drew (and redrew) between practice (in the narrower sense) and morality. On the basis of his phenomenological analyses of human experience, he held that moral values are plural, sui generis, and universal. Their universality corresponds, as it were, to the category 'human'; for, as Beach puts it, 'the moral' for Kolnai is the 'uniquely human mode of existence' (p. 175). Or, in Kolnai's own words, 'what distinguishes man from the "brutes" is his being morally accountable' (p. 173). And this accountability -- the 'imperative need' to justify our conduct morally in objective terms -- is prior to, more urgent than, any other. Not that life is ineluctably moral; Kolnai had a robust appreciation of the irreducible diversity of human interests. But equally, he had an acute sense of the autonomy and priority of the moral. In particular, in the course of his lifetime he saw the catastrophic consequences of pursuing a politics that ignores or subordinates morality. Even more terrifying, perhaps, is a politics that appropriates the moral by assimilating it to its own idea: the perfecting of society; in a word, utopianism. Two of the papers in part II -- one by Pierre Manent and the other by David Wiggins -- are devoted to Kolnai's anti-utopian writing. If this theme has special relevance in the first decade of the twenty-first century, with its apocalyptic political ideologies, so do the manifold qualities of imaginative intelligence with which Kolnai illuminated the world of human practice.

This collection can be viewed as the latest installment in a long-term publication project that one of the editors, Francis Dunlop, has been pursuing since Kolnai's death in 1973. Kolnai, who suffered much misfortune in his life, was fortunate in having Dunlop as one of his last graduate students. So are we.

1 'Intercollegiate Course 1970-2', quoted by David Wiggins and Bernard Williams in their biographical introduction to Ethics, Value and Reality: Selected Papers of Aurel Kolnai, ed. Francis Dunlop and Brian Klug, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1978, p. xxiii.

2 Ibid.