Expressing Our Attitudes: Explanation and Expression in Ethics, Volume 2

Placeholder book cover

Mark Schroeder, Expressing Our Attitudes: Explanation and Expression in Ethics, Volume 2, Oxford University Press, 2015, 266pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198714149.

Reviewed by Nate Charlow, University of Toronto


Over the last decade -- owing largely to renewed philosophical interest in discourse what probably or likely or must be the case -- Expressivism has been revitalized as an empirical thesis about the semantics of natural language. The basic ideas -- for instance, the idea that to think that φ is probable is to exceed a certain threshold confidence in φ, rather than to bear the relation of outright belief to the propositional content that it is probable that φ, or the idea that one's confidence in an indicative conditional p q equals one's conditional confidence in q given p, rather than one's confidence in the truth of a conditional proposition -- have been in place for many decades now (especially among Bayesians). But the conceptual and formal innovations required to reify these ideas for use in generative semantic theorizing were developed only relatively recently (we might point to early work of Eric Swanson and Seth Yalcin as the ignition point).

Mark Schroeder stands out as Expressivism's most original and trenchant critic over this period. (He is also, it may surprise some readers to learn, its most determined and original innovator.) The present volume collects nine of Schroeder's papers, the earliest dating from 2008, two previously unpublished, on the subject of Expressivism. These papers, of course, merit careful individual study. Something, however, that recommends reading them together is Schroeder's novel positive view (further discussed below) about the nature of propositions and propositional cognition -- a view whose content and attractions are best appreciated from the standpoint of the entire volume. Rather than summarizing and critiquing the book piecemeal, this review will aim to give a sense of Schroeder's positive view and how it emerges from the manifold discussions in this volume (though it will end with some criticisms).[1]

The core Expressivist commitment, according to Schroeder (and myself), is to "replace a metaphysical mode of explanation with a psychological one" (4). Consider Expressivism about some claim φ. Instead of providing a characterization of what the world must be like in order for φ to be the case -- i.e., instead of providing metaphysically necessary and sufficient conditions (or, we might say, an "analysis") for φ -- Expressivists try instead to provide a general characterization of what it is to think that φ -- an attitude which is not equivalent to a representational attitude with the content of φ's analysans. Since contemporary philosophical theorizing has assigned an outsized role to the methodology and aims of the "analytic" method, Expressivism involves a potentially revolutionary view of philosophical methodology and aims. An illustration: an Expressivist about "knowledge" might hold that thinking one knows that φ is thinking that φ in a particularly assured way, and that to utter the thought that one knows that φ is to express this thought, in this way, to one's audience. To understand this fact is, on this view, to fully understand the conventional role of "knowledge" in our cognitive and linguistic economy: an analysis of knowledge in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions is otiose (and impossible anyway).

The core motivation for Expressivism about a family of claims F is therefore suspicion of explanations of the conventional role of F-claims in our cognitive and linguistic economy in the "metaphysical" mode. Instead of identifying a proposition x that is necessarily equivalent to some F-claim φ, the Expressivist urges us to reflect on what it is to think (and express) that φ, free of the presupposition that thinking (expressing) that φ is equivalent to thinking (expressing) x. Such suspicion can be warranted in various ways (depending on the family of claims at issue). In the epistemological domain, suspicion might be underwritten by the unanalyzability of knowledge in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions (though of course other responses, like Timothy Williamson's, are available). In theorizing about the indicative conditional, suspicion is motivated by the fact that there is no proposition x such that x's probability always equals the conditional probability of q on p (Lewis, 1976). Thus, if believing the indicative conditional pq to degree d is a matter of having confidence d in q given p, there is no proposition x such that believing that pq to degree d is a matter of having probabilistically measured confidence d in x. In the moral domain, Motivational Internalism (together with the Humean Theory of Motivation) seems to tell us that there is no proposition x such that one believes that murder is wrong just if one believes x.

Such suspicions can be more or less compelling.[2] If, however, one takes them seriously, and attempts to vindicate them with a psychologized, rather than "metaphysical," theory of meaning for F-claims, things get very dicey very quickly. There is, of course, the Frege-Geach Problem, about which Schroeder has much to say in this volume (see also Schroeder, 2008a,b,c). But this is just one instance of a far more general problem for the Expressivist. In shifting from the metaphysical to the psychological mode of explanation of the role of F-claims in our cognitive and linguistic economy, the Expressivist seems to jettison propositions (along with all of their very explanatorily useful properties). Here is a partial inventory from the volume:

1. Propositions (and propositional beliefs) are the typical relatum of the expression relation; a declarative sentence expressing the proposition p can express the belief that p, in virtue of the sentence and belief having the same propositional content. This standard "same content" account fails for the Expressivist: in Expressivism, psychological attitudes are the fundamental relatum of the expression relation; if sentences express contents, they do so in virtue of expressing attitudes. Expressivists who jettison proposition-type semantic values therefore require a non-standard account of what it is for a sentence to express an attitude. (Chapter 1)

2. A family of constructions in natural language -- attitude verbs ('believes', 'desires', 'supposes'), modal/alethic/probabilistic operators ('might', 'it's false that', 'probably') -- appear to take proposition-type arguments. A satisfying expressivism about F-claims must explain why (e.g.) beliefs in ordinary descriptive claims and beliefs in F-claims have so many features in common (e.g., being degreed), if their arguments are (contrary to appearance) not univocally propositional. (Chapter 3)

3. Since sentences express attitudes, two-place sentential connectives (e.g., the material conditional) must express functions from pairs of attitudes into attitudes. The value of this function for a pair of attitudes must explain:

a. Why there is logical pressure on an agent who has the attitudes expressed by the premises of, e.g., a modus ponens argument to have the attitude expressed by the conclusion. Such logical pressure is only present on the assumption that (i) pq expresses the same attitude as 'it's false that p ∧ ¬q', (ii) the attitude expressed by 'it's false that p ∧ ¬q' is logically inconsistent with the attitude expressed by p together with the attitude expressed by ¬q. Property (ii) is mysterious unless 'it's false that' expresses propositional negation. If 'it's false that' does not express an operation on propositions, but rather expresses the attitude of, say, rejecting its complement, then there is predicted to be an atomic sentence that likewise expresses this rejection (e.g., 'I hereby express my rejection of p ∧ ¬q') which is not logically inconsistent with the attitude expressed by p together with the attitude expressed by ¬q. (Chapter 2)

b. Which attitude, in general, is assigned to a logically complex sentence -- for example, which attitude is expressed by a "mixed" disjunction of the form p ∨ φ (with φ an F-claim). Accounts on which p and φ express psychological properties of different type -- e.g., a constraint on one's descriptive beliefs and a constraint on one's desires -- tend strongly, and incorrectly, to predict that this attitude is a disjunctive attitude: the attitude of believing that p or believing that φ (since, roughly, the properties expressed by p and φ do not compositionally interact). Abandoning propositional contents means the Expressivist cannot appeal to a standard story of belief in mixed disjunctions (on which this is simply belief in a disjunctive proposition) (Chapter 9).[3]

This is an impressive catalogue of difficulties, for which this volume suggests an intriguing solution: Expressivists should simply embrace propositions! What, however, would this mean for Expressivism? To this reviewer, it is not entirely clear. A helpful initial contrast is provided with the Hybrid Expressivist's embrace of propositions: according to Hybrid Expressivists about F-claims, F-claims have a dual meaning: propositional and what we might term "expressive". (For instance, a Hybrid Expressivist about 'wrong' might hold that 'murder is wrong' denotes the proposition that murder has some non-moral property P, while expressing disapproval of actions that have P.) Dual meanings of this sort are, however, theoretically vexing, and Schroeder argues plausibly (in his well-known 2009, reprinted here as Chapter 6) that Hybrid Expressivists about moral language -- who are forced to implausibly stipulate disapproval of actions that have P as a necessary condition of semantic competence with 'wrong' -- ultimately fare no better than Moral Realists in accounting for the connection between sincere moral judgment and motivation -- a connection which is, we've noted, important in motivating the Expressivist shift away from the metaphysical mode of explanation in the meta-ethical domain.

Expressivists, Schroeder suggests (Chapter 7), might instead try to generalize the Hybrid technique, by holding that the meaning of an F-claim φ is given by a set of pairs (α, p) of attitudes and ordinary descriptive belief-contents, such that an agent with a certain configuration of attitudes α believes that φ just if the agent believes ordinary descriptive content p. On this sort of view, which Schroeder dubs Relational Expressivism,

there is no particular ordinary descriptive belief or desire-like attitude that you need to have, in order to accept a normative sentence; you must simply instantiate the right relationship between these two aspects of your overall state of mind. This absolves the relational expressivist of needing to be able to say what property moral terms pick out, and it allows for people with very different attitudes to all count as having views about what is wrong or not. (204)

Relational Expressivism -- and Schroeder's observation that it is simply a version of Allan Gibbard's planning semantics, with certain assumptions relaxed -- is one of the most interesting positive innovations of this volume. Relational Expressivism, however, can only give a possibly correct account of a mixed disjunction p ∨ φ, on the assumption that, for each α, there is some non-trivial descriptive content that is required in order to believe that φ for an agent characterized by α. (If, for instance, an agent characterized by α requires no further descriptive information to believe that φ -- if, say, φ expresses a "pure state of norm-acceptance", à la Gibbard -- then any such agent who believes that p ∨ φ is wrongly predicted to believe that φ, since the agent meets the trivial informational condition on believing that φ.) And this is precisely the sort of commitment that Expressivists (including this reviewer) are generally loath to take on.

Where does this leave us? Expressivists might avoid the difficulties Schroeder poses by embracing propositions, though this embrace will probably not occur in the manner suggested by Hybrid or Relational Expressivism. What would this embrace look like, and how could it be made consistent with Expressivists' rejection of explanations in the metaphysical mode? Schroeder's key thesis here is negative: Expressivists should reject the identification of propositions with representational contents (see especially Chapter 4).

I will therefore reserve 'proposition' as a name for the entities which are the objects of the attitudes and the bearers of truth and falsity, and will use 'representational content' for the entities, whatever they are, which mark out distinctions in reality, are associated with metaphysical commitment, and are the appropriate objects of excluded middle. (88)

Explanations in terms of representational contents are explanations in the metaphysical mode. But -- and this is key -- explanations in terms of propositions need not be, if propositions are simply whatever entities function as the objects of attitudes like belief (and the possession of belief does not amount, in the case of believing an F-claim φ, to representing reality φ-wise).

The notion of "proposition" that should be invoked is, as things stand, a black-box (though, of course, it would be up to Expressivists, rather than their critics, to dispel the darkness). In Schroeder's own version of Expressivism, propositions are, roughly speaking, psychological features that are not generally equivalent to outright descriptive belief (see especially 92ff and his 2008a). This entails that, for an agent with a belief in an uncontroversially representational content (e.g., that grass is green), the object of that agent's belief is a feature of herself -- in this case, taking it "as settled in deciding what to do" that grass is green. This is loosely akin to the view of Lewis (1979), with an important difference: for Lewis, the functional role of feature-directed belief is cashed out in terms of self-location, while, for Schroeder, its functional role is "to lead one to acquire that property" (92).[4] This seems plausible enough -- to believe that grass is green is, perhaps, just to be disposed in a certain way to acquire the property of taking it "as settled in deciding what to do" that grass is green. But, of course, we often treat (e.g.) moral claims, probabilistic claims, and indicative conditionals as settled in deciding what to do. More generally, the attitude of treating it as settled that p (for descriptive p) and treating it as settled that φ (for F-claim φ) seem to have a great many features in common -- both, for instance, come in degrees. And so it would appear that at least one of the difficulties for which Schroeder proposes the embrace of propositions as a solution -- what he terms the "Expressivist Attitude Dialectic" (5) -- is liable to simply reassert itself in the metalanguage.

This highlights one of this reviewer's general difficulties with the position Schroeder stakes out in this volume: its overemphasis of the advantages of what we might call the "propositional" mode of explanation. That said, it is tantalizing to think about the progress that might be made by adopting a fleshed-out analysis of propositions -- say, Scott Soames' notion on which a proposition is a type of (possibly non-representational) cognitive event (which seems to have a great deal of affinity with Schroeder's notion of a proposition as a psychological feature) -- and seeing how the view develops (for a recent attempt to adapt Soames' understanding of propositions to a form of Expressivism, see Ridge, 2014).

Though this volume offers pointed empirical critiques of the semantic proposals of certain "linguistically inclined" Expressivists (Yalcin, in particular, in Chapter 9), it does not, in the view of this reviewer, enter into a productive dialogue with these theorists about the nature of the Expressivist project in semantic theorizing. This is important, since these theorists have, by and large, jettisoned the psychologistic mode of semantic theorizing that is Schroeder's main target in this book. Yalcin (2012a), for example, opts for a "pragmatic" reading of expressivism, on which theoretical claims like 'S expressed α in uttering φ' constrain the kind of semantic value we might assign to φ, in the following fashion: "knowledge of the compositional semantic value of [φ], together with any standing mutually known pragmatic norms and relevant facts of context, must be sufficient to determine" that S expresses α in uttering φ (Yalcin 2012a: 142; compare also Charlow 2015: §5). Such pragmatic facts are smoothly derivable from a semantics which attempts only to offer a recursive characterization of φ's truth relative to a point of evaluation (so long as the points of evaluation utilized by the Expressivist are not possible worlds). It is difficult, from this vantage, to know quite what to make of claims like "the Big Idea of pure expressivists about the Frege-Geach problem is to treat the logical connectives not as functions from propositions to propositions, but as functions from mental states to mental states" (37). Pragmatics is not compositional semantics -- indeed pragmatic explanations are not generally assumed to be constrained by the requirement of compositionality at all.

Schroeder may be interpreted as addressing this sort of position in Chapter 8, where he argues that, even in a semantics which aspires only to provide a recursive characterization of truth relative to a point of evaluation, "our choice of formal system still needs to be informed by our understanding of how that formal system is to be interpreted" (219). Even if there is strong empirical motivation for introducing, e.g., relativity to planning or probability function indices in the compositional semantics, Relativists and Expressivists will (and should) disagree about which compositional semantic system correctly incorporates this sort of relativity, since

expressivism and relativism make competing claims about the significance of the attribution of a particular semantic value to a particular sentence, even when they employ the same underlying formal system. It is a direct consequence of this that they need to assign different semantic values to the sentences that may be used to formulate their competing claims. Consequently, they can only employ the exact same formal system for fragments of the language that do not include their metasemantic vocabulary. (223)

This is an important, but subtle, point. Here is one way of putting it. Some constructions in natural language (e.g., 'believes that') appear to take as arguments the value attributed, by Yalcin, to an F-claim φ in the pragmatics. A complete Expressivist semantics must have a theory of the semantics of such constructions that is explanatorily adequate, and this raises difficulties (recall especially problems (2) and (3B) above). But it is incorrect, given how linguistically inclined Expressivists have chosen to state their theory, to insist that the fundamental semantic features of φ must be explained in terms of the Expressivist's account of the 'believes that φ' construction (though it is correct to note that Expressivists like Simon Blackburn and Gibbard have wanted to explain the semantic features of φ in just this way).

The point, therefore, that seems to this reviewer to survive is this: Expressivists are ultimately on the hook for giving us an explanatorily adequate account of what it is, by their lights, to believe that p ∨ φ, and this will exert some form of pressure on the Expressivist's account of the compositional semantics for φ (as Schroeder argues in Chapter 9). This is an interesting and underappreciated way of understanding the dialectic around Expressivism -- one that is, rather interestingly, shared by Yalcin (2012a). But it is one in which traditional concerns like the Frege-Geach and Negation Problems will loom less large than they once did -- though, of course, other explanatory pressures seem liable to rise in their stead.

Substantive worries to the side, Schroeder deserves congratulations for this volume. A volume of collected papers that can be profitably read as a monograph -- one, moreover, that succeeds in advancing a potentially field-defining major thesis (even considering the concerns raised here about that thesis) -- is rare indeed. This is such a volume, and this reviewer hopes and expects that the ideas developed within will influence discussion for many years to come.


Thanks to Mark Schroeder for comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Charlow, N. (2015). Prospects for an expressivist theory of meaning. Philosophers' Imprint, 15:1-43.

Charlow, N. (2016). Triviality for restrictor conditionals. Noûs, 50:533-564.

Lewis, D. (1976). Probabilities of conditionals and conditional probabilities. The Philosophical Review, 85:297-315.

Lewis, D. (1979). Attitudes de dicto and de se. The Philosophical Review, 88:513-543.

MacFarlane, J. (2016). Vagueness as indecision. Ms.

Richard, M. (2008). When Truth Gives Out. Oxford University Press.

Ridge, M. (2014). Impassioned Belief. Oxford University Press.

Schroeder, M. (2008a). Being For. Oxford University Press.

Schroeder, M. (2008b). How expressivists can and should solve their problems with negation. Noûs, 42:573-599.

Schroeder, M. (2008c). What is the Frege-Geach problem? Philosophy Compass, 3/4:703-720.

Schroeder, M. (2009). Hybrid expressivism: Virtues and vices. Ethics, 119:257-309.

Yalcin, S. (2012a). Bayesian expressivism. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, CXII, Part 2:123-160.

Yalcin, S. (2012b). Context probabilism. In Aloni, M., Kimmelman, V., Roelofsen, F., Sassoon, G., Schulz, K., and Westera, M., editors, Proceedings of the 18th Amsterdam Colloquium, pages 12-21. ILLC.

[1] This review will pass over Schroeder's discussions of Expressivism about truth and its application to the proper understanding of the T-Schema (Chapters 4 and 5). These chapters represent promising applications of Expressivism to topics of perennial philosophical interest -- and an improvement on similar treatments like the one found in Richard (2008) -- but it is difficult for me to connect them to the volume's major theme in the space I have here.

[2] This reviewer rejects Expressivism about moral adjectives, but endorses it for modal and conditional language (and, more generally, any sort of language for which there is a plausible Triviality theorem). For a Triviality theorem for modal language, see Charlow (2016).

[3] The dialectic around the mixed disjunction problem is complex, since it would appear that it can be avoided with some trivial-seeming formal maneuvers. (See, e.g., MacFarlane (2016, fn5), though MacFarlane may be read as embracing the Schroederian idea that p ∨ φ expresses a disjunctive proposition, and that acceptance of p ∨ φ is a propositional attitude.) Charlow (2015, §3.3) argues that a form of the disjunction problem remains, even on a MacFarlane-type account.

[4] It bears noting, however, that in certain frameworks -- e.g., the supervaluational framework of Yalcin (2012a,b) -- self-locating amongst a space of possible agents who have in common psychological property P is equivalent to the instantiation of P.