Expressivism, Pragmatism and Representationalism

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Huw Price, Expressivism, Pragmatism and Representationalism, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 204pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521279062.

Reviewed by John MacFarlane, University of California, Berkeley


This volume includes Huw Price's three René Descartes Lectures, given in 2008 at the Tilburg Center for Logic and Philosophy of Science, together with commentary essays by Simon Blackburn, Robert Brandom, Paul Horwich, and Michael Williams. In a concluding postscript, Price clarifies and refines his view in response to points raised by the commentators.

The lectures are a manifesto for Price's particular brand of neo-pragmatism. Philosophical naturalists, Price argues, ought to be subject naturalists and global expressivists.

By subject naturalism, Price means the view that

philosophy needs to begin with what science tells us about ourselves. Science tells us that we humans are natural creatures, and if the claims and ambitions of philosophy conflict with this view, then philosophy needs to give way. This is naturalism in the sense of Hume, then, and arguably Nietzsche. (5)

He contrasts this with object naturalism, the view that "all there is is the world studied by science," and that "all genuine knowledge is scientific knowledge" (4-5). Since object naturalism implies that we are natural creatures, it seems that an object naturalist must be a subject naturalist too. The converse is not true, however, and Price recommends accepting subject naturalism while rejecting object naturalism:

Priority Thesis: Subject naturalism is theoretically prior to object naturalism, because the latter depends on validation from a subject naturalist perspective. (6)

Invalidity Thesis: There are strong reasons for doubting whether object naturalism deserves to be 'validated' -- whether its presuppositions do survive subject naturalist scrutiny. (6)

The argument for the Priority Thesis goes something like this. Instead of starting out by asking where Xs fit in the natural order, subject naturalism (and hence object naturalism) recommends that we start by considering our thought and talk of Xs. If there is an explanation of this that does not posit the existence of Xs in the natural order, then we will have to acknowledge that some of the things we think there are -- namely Xs -- are not part of the natural order, and this will amount to a rejection of object naturalism. Object naturalism is secure only if such explanations can be ruled out globally. And they can be ruled out globally, Price thinks, only given the representationalist assumption: "the assumption that the linguistic items in question 'stand for' or 'represent' something non-linguistic" (9). Thus, object naturalism can be vindicated from a subject naturalist point of view only if a global representationalist assumption can be vindicated. (Price doubts it can be, hence the Invalidity Thesis.)

In his commentary essay, Horwich worries about Price's assumption that the investigation should begin in the formal, rather than the material mode. But even if we grant this starting point, it is hard to see how object naturalism could depend on the representationalist assumption for its vindication. Suppose we had the representationalist assumption for, say, "morally right." At most, that would entitle us to conclude that

(1) Our talk of actions being "morally right" commits us to a property of moral rightness, which this predicate represents.

But (1) is compatible with moral rightness being a non-natural property. To get a commitment to a natural property of moral rightness from (1), we would need an auxiliary premise:

(2) Everything in the world order (every object and property) is under the purview of the natural sciences.

And (2) just is object naturalism. So, the representationalist assumption doesn't help us get from subject to object naturalism unless we already have object naturalism.

For this reason, I think Price would be better served by thinking of object naturalism in the way Brandom suggests in his commentary essay: not as an ontological and epistemological thesis, but as a package of "three, in principle independent, commitments: to a naturalistic representational semantics" (88). Price's important point is then that subject naturalism fully accommodates the impulses of philosophical naturalism, and that the step to object naturalism -- a much stronger position -- must be justified from a subject-naturalist perspective if it is to be justified at all.

In his second lecture, Price moves from the rejection of global representationalism to the endorsement of global anti-representationalism, which he calls global expressivism. The name is unfortunate, for reasons Price acknowledges himself in his postscript (176). Not all of the non-representational accounts of language and thought he envisions involve the expression of attitudes: consider, for example, deflationist accounts of "true". And not all forms of expressivism are non-representationalist: as Williams points out in his essay (132), to analyze normative claims as expressing attitudes with a world-to-mind direction of fit, for example, is to think of them in representationalist terms. Price uses the name "global expressivism" to help "mark a trail," as he puts it, from familiar positions to the less familiar one he is recommending. The idea is that the general explanatory strategy local expressivists have used to explain specific bits of language can be extended to all of our thought and talk.

Local expressivists, Price notes, have tended to accept the bifurcation thesis: "the doctrine that there is a line to be drawn in language, between descriptive and non-descriptive uses" (30). They propose expressivist accounts of the non-descriptive parts of language, and assume a standard representational account of the descriptive parts. But the bifurcation thesis is problematic. It leads to a "two-tier view of the landscape:"

In effect, [the local expressivist] must think that there are both loose and strict answers to questions such as: what is it to be a belief, an assertion, a statement, a judgement, a proposition (even a fact)? The loose answer is supposed to tell us what descriptive and quasi-descriptive uses of language have in common, the strict answer what separates the real cases from the merely quasi-cases. (30)

The strict notion of belief is the one the expressivist deploys in saying that normative statements express plans or desires rather than beliefs. The loose notion is the one we use in ordinary practice, when we say that Sherlock believes he ought to pack. Inside ordinary practice, the contrast that seems central to the expressivist's thesis thus seems to disappear: this is the problem of "creeping minimalism" (Dreier 2004).

A further problem with the bifurcation thesis is that it is unclear where one could draw a principled line between descriptive and non-descriptive language. Among the targets of local expressivists are modal and causal notions. But, as Wilfrid Sellars observed, the language of science is shot through with modal and causal notions. If we cannot take the language of science as our paradigm of "descriptive" language, we begin to lose our grip on what "descriptive" could mean.

Price urges that the way out of this morass is to "go global." The bifurcation thesis, he argues, is an optional commitment of quasi-realism:

the bifurcation thesis, and in particular the belief that some claims are genuinely descriptive, play no role at all in the positive story, in the case of the commitments the expressivist regards as not genuinely descriptive. In other words, the expressivist's positive alternative to the matching model doesn't depend on the claim that the matching model is ever a useful model of the relation between natural language and the natural world. So there's no evident barrier to abandoning the matching model altogether and endorsing global expressivism. (30)

Not only is there no obstacle, there is an internal pressure to go global. Price argues that in order to explain the "loose" notions of assertion and belief, the quasi-realist needs some non-representationalist account of what is common to all assertoric uses of language, descriptive and non-descriptive alike. (As a candidate he suggests Brandom's account of assertions as moves in a "game of giving and asking for reasons" (32).) But once we have this, we no longer need to think of assertion in such a way that only descriptive claims count as assertions in the strict sense, and the local expressivist's bifurcations can be dismissed.

This may look like a capitulation to creeping minimalism. But Price insists that recognizing what is in common to all assertions does not prevent us from marking important distinctions between normative and descriptive assertions. These distinctions can be drawn without bifurcating notions like belief, assertion, truth, and fact. Instead, Price suggests we replace the bad old notion of representation with two successor notions. The first, e-representation, is the notion of answerability to the environment that we try to capture with notions like indication, tracking, or covariance. The second, i-representation, is internal to the game of giving and asking for reasons, and derives from the cognitive or inferential role of expressions. Players "i-represent" things in the sense that they bind themselves to standards beyond themselves. (Brandom, in his essay, suggests that we think of i-representational relations as that which is made explicit by the de re components of attitude ascriptions, 105.) With these notions in hand, we can acknowledge that only a subset of our assertions are e-representational. To use Blackburn's example (73), we have no hope of explaining our use of nautical charts without reference to their environment-tracking role, while environment-tracking plays no role in our explanation of normative concepts.

If there was something objectionable about the original bifurcation thesis, it is not entirely clear to me how this second bifurcation of the notion of representation fares better. After all, one can use it to recreate the local expressivist's strict and loose senses of assertion, facts, and truth: for example, a fact in the strict sense is a true content that functions as an e-representation. Indeed, in the third lecture Price accepts something very much like this: a bifurcation of the notion of "world" into i-world and e-world, where "the e-world simply is the i-world of the scientific vocabulary" (55). Price's aim is "to have all the advantages of traditional expressivism, without the big disadvantage: the need to make good the bifurcation thesis -- to find a radical divide in language, where usage marks none" (41). But Price accepts the divide. He just tones down the rhetoric, avoiding words like "strict" and "loose" in describing what, on his view, is just one of many interesting distinctions between kinds of thought and talk.

The rejection of object naturalism requires only local anti-representationalism, of the sort displayed by local expressivists. Global anti-representationalism -- the claim that our best scientific account of language, thought, and communication will make no use of substantial word-world semantic relations -- would appear to be a much stronger commitment. But it is a bit hard to tell just how strong it is, because it is not entirely clear what counts as a "substantial word-world semantic relation."

At times Price seems to identify anti-representationalism with the project of giving piecemeal "explanations of meaning in terms of use" -- as Williams calls them, EMUs. Here is Williams's sample EMU for "true":

1. (I-T): A material-inferential (intra-linguistic) component. Excepting sentences that generate paradox, the inference from 'Snow is white' to 'It is true that snow is white,' and vice versa, is always good; the inference from 'Grass is green' to 'It is true that grass is green,' and vice versa, is always good, and so on.

2. (E-T): An epistemological component. Such inferences are primitively acceptable (a priori). They are 'free' moves in the discursive game.

3. (F-T): A functional component. The truth predicate is important exclusively as a generalising device. It enables us to do things that we could not otherwise do: endorse or repudiate claims that we cannot explicitly state because we do not know what they are ('You can trust John: anything he tells you will be true') or because there are too many ('Every proposition of the form "p or not-p" is true'). (135)

Williams also provides EMUs for causal claims, color words, and "ought." Price is enthusiastic, and even considers the name "global EMU-theorist" as an alternative for the inapt "global expressivist" (176 n. 14). So we might interpret global expressivism as the thesis that our best scientific account of language will consist of EMUs, rather than recursive truth definitions of the sort used in truth-conditional semantics.

But if that's what the thesis comes to, it seems an implausible bet on the future of linguistics. One thing that any account of meaning must be able to explain is the way in which we can bring together our knowledge of the meanings of various words and syntactic modes of combination to yield knowledge of the meanings of novel complexes formed from them. This is something truth-conditional semantics does very well. EMUs do it very badly.

To illustrate, let's compare Williams' EMU for "true" with these two alternative truth-conditional clauses for "true":

(True-1) The extension of "true" at context C and index w is the set of propositions that are true at w.

(True-2) The extension of "true" at context C and index w is the set of propositions that are true at wC.

Either of these semantics would (together with plausible additional assumptions) validate and explain all three components of the EMU: I-T, E-T, and F-T. But they would make different predictions about how "true" behaves when embedded in modal contexts: True-1, but not True-2, correctly predicts that (3) should seem obviously false:

(3) The proposition that snow is cold would be true even if snow were hot.

Because the EMU is compatible with both True-1 and True-2, it just doesn't say enough to settle the status of (3). (It is not enough to object that the EMU for "true" together with the EMU for counterfactuals would explain the data, since whatever account we give of counterfactuals had better allow for the possibility of modally rigid predicates.)

This is not to deny that the observations about the inferential role and broader function of expressions that impress Price and Williams are important. Any account of the meanings of the expressions at issue ought to explain these things. But they are not themselves adequate accounts of meaning, because they do not compose.

Perhaps, though, an anti-representationalist need not be an EMU theorist. Perhaps an anti-representationalist could proceed much as the truth-conditional semanticist does, giving recursive truth definitions for sentences, and giving these definitions empirical significance by telling a pragmatic story about the role of truth in our linguistic and conceptual practices. (Truth is the norm for assertion; there is social pressure to converge on the truth; etc.) Truth conditions would, on this view, be compact ways of codifying complex systems of norms. This would be a very natural approach for Price, who has usefully explored the practical and normative significance of truth (Price 2010).

Alternatively, our pragmatic story might avoid talk of truth altogether. Yalcin (2012), generalizing ideas of Stalnaker and Gibbard, has suggested that we think of expressivism not as a semantic thesis, but as a pragmatic one: a matter of the significance we give to a semantic theory's assignments of semantic values, not the form the theory takes. He shows how we can integrate a semantics for epistemic modal and probabilistic expressions in a truth-conditional style with a pragmatic story about what we are doing in making assertions -- one that denies that in asserting probabilistic claims we are representing the world as being a certain way. The general idea is that the semantic values represent constraints on our mental states; and in making and accepting or rejecting assertions with these semantic values, we are seeking to coordinate our mental states. Such a story should be very congenial to Price, who says:

At its simplest, my proposal is that the assertoric language game is simply a coordination device for social creatures, whose welfare depends on collaborative action. It helps to reduce differences among the behavioural dispositions, or other variable aspects of speakers' situations, on which such action depends. (49)

It seems to me that both of these approaches are consistent with what Brandom calls "methodological pragmatism": the idea that semantic distinctions are justified by their role in systematizing proprieties of use (cf. MacFarlane 2010). Could they count as anti-representationalist, or does an anti-representationalist have to be an EMU-thesis? I confess that my understanding of what Price means by "representationalism" is not sharp enough to answer this question. It does not help that Price tends to characterize representationalism using words like "stand for" or "represent" in scare quotes, or phrases like "substantive semantic relation," whose meanings aren't any clearer than "representationalism" itself. (There is so little explicit attention to this issue in the lectures and commentaries that I sometimes felt like an imposter: if you have to ask, you shouldn't be here!)

Unfortunately there is not space here to say much in detail about the commentaries or Price's long postscript. The commentators are well-chosen. All are all advocates of use-based explanations of meaning, though for different reasons and in different ways. To this extent they are all fellow travelers, and I wished that there had been a rabid representationalist in the mix. But the commentaries are all excellent and insightful, and they provoke Price to clarify aspects of his view. I especially enjoyed Brandom's efforts to re-express Price's points in terms of his own highly developed set of categories. Price's postscript is notable especially for its extensive discussion of Sellars, whom he reads as anticipating his own distinction between i-representation and e-representation.

This book could serve as a nice introduction to contemporary neo-pragmatism, from the standpoint of some of its key practitioners. Those who think that the devil is in the details will find it maddeningly big-picture. Price does little to show what a global expressivist view would look like or what obstacles it might face. But he does do a lot of very interesting "trail marking," and with a bit of walking the reader will be rewarded with a view of the turbulent confluence of two great rivers: the expressivist programs of twentieth century philosophy and the American pragmatist tradition leading from Sellars through Rorty and Brandom. Reading the book, I was struck by the fact that, although these two great intellectual currents have much in common, they are rarely discussed together. Price deserves credit for raising the fascinating topic of how they are related.


Dreier, Jamie. 2004. "Meta-Ethics and the Problem of Creeping Minimalism." Philosophical Perspectives 18: 23-44.

MacFarlane, John. 2010. "Pragmatism and Inferentialism." In Reading Brandom: On Making It Explicit, edited by Bernhard Weiss and Jeremy Wanderer, 81-95. London: Routledge.

Price, Huw. 2010. "Truth as Convenient Friction." In Naturalism and Normativity, edited by Mario de Caro and David MacArthur, 229-252. New York: Columbia University Press.

Yalcin, Seth. 2012. "Bayesian Expressivism." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 112: 123-160.