Extended Epistemology

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J. Adam Carter, Andy Clark, Jesper Kallestrup, S. Orestis Palermos, and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Extended Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2018, 362pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198769811.

Reviewed by Deborah Tollefsen, University of Memphis






                                                 Imgres 2


In 1998 Andy Clark and David Chalmers published an article entitled "The Extended Mind" in which they argued that the mind extends beyond the skull. This was, and to many still is, a rather remarkable thesis. To be clear, they weren't the first to challenge the boundaries of the mind. Others had argued that the mind is embodied and that, because of the interdependence between body and mind, cognition isn't located solely in the head. But Clark and Chalmers took it even further and argued that it extends even beyond the body to include aspects of the environment such as laptops and notebooks.

As the editors note in their helpful introduction, "The Extended Mind" contains two distinct theses: The extended cognition thesis and the extended mind thesis. The extended cognition thesis is the thesis that cognitive processes such as memory or perception can (and sometimes do) extend beyond the boundaries of the skin. The extended mind thesis makes a stronger claim. According to this thesis, it is not just processes but mental states themselves that can be extended. More precisely, according to the extended mind thesis, mental states, such as belief, are constituted by elements of the environment. This is also called vehicle externalism in the literature in order to distinguish it from content externalism. This anthology is the first of a set of two volumes that explores the epistemological implications of these theses. In what follows, I offer a summary of each of the articles and a brief discussion of the volume's strengths and weaknesses.

In "Access Internalism and the Extended Mind," Declan Smithies argues that the extended mind thesis should be rejected on the grounds that it conflicts with a type of access internalism that he has defended elsewhere (Smithies 2012). The argument goes something like this: Smithies' access internalism is independently established via a Moorean argument. This access internalism is incompatible with vehicle externalism. Therefore, vehicle externalism must be false. A lot rests here on Smithies' argument for access internalism. But even if one ultimately remains unconvinced by it, this article sets up nicely the conflict between vehicle externalism and certain forms of epistemological internalism.

In "Extended Circularity: A New Puzzle for Extended Cognition," J. Adam Carter and Jesper Kallestrup focus on the thesis of extended cognition. In order to avoid the problem of cognitive bloat -- where everything with which we are in causal contact becomes part of the mind -- Clark has proposed conditions (what have become known in the literature as "trust and glue" conditions) for non-biological artifacts to count as part of a cognitive system (Clark 2008, 46):

  1. "the resource must be reliably available and typically invoked";
  2. "any information thus retrieved must be more-or-less automatically endorsed"; and
  3. "information contained in the resources should be easily accessible as and when required."

Carter and Kallestrup argue that these conditions are not sufficient and that an additional condition needs to be met. They offer an endorsement condition:

4. The reliability of the resource must be reliably and non-circularly endorsed.

But, according to Carter and Kallestrup, a problem arises once one accepts this additional condition. Consider the now famous case of Otto, whose memory is poor and who must rely on his notebook to recall where the museum is. The notebook seems to meet the "trust and glue" conditions and is supposed to be a paradigm example of extended cognition. However, Otto can't appeal to the notebook to endorse the reliability of the notebook as this would be circular. Nor can Otto endorse his notebook reliably by relying on his biological memory because his biological memory is, by stipulation, unreliable. Carter and Kallestrup consider, but ultimately reject, two possible responses to the puzzle. Since the problem of circularity remains a problem for most epistemological theories, it is not clear that extended epistemology is any worse off in this respect.

In "Extended Cognition, Trust and Glue, and Knowledge," Kenneth Aizawa brings the constitution-causation distinction to discussions of extended epistemology. He then provides a new argument in the form of a thought experiment involving two students to argue against extended epistemology. Opie attends class regularly, does the homework and reading, and studies diligently for the first exam. He receives a 92. Otis, a slacker, never goes to class, never reads or does the homework, and, instead of studying and memorizing the material, copies things on to notecards and brings them with him to the exam and secretly looks at them in order to answer the questions. He receives a 92 as well. The professor is surprised by Otis' grade given that she has rarely seen him or his homework. She questions Otis about his performance, and he admits that he used the notecards but, because they meet the trust and glue conditions, they are no different than using a calculator -- which all students were allowed to use. The professor is not persuaded by Clark and Chalmers' argument and fails the student. According to Aizawa,

to do justice to cases of poor testing, as in the Opie-Otis thought experiment, one needs to have a more robust account of cognitive capacities. And, a recommended point of departure is to say that cognitive capacities must involve specific sorts of manipulations of representations bearing on non-derived content. (p. 77)

This thought experiment is one of the most interesting in the volume; I wish I had space here to discuss it further. The epistemic norms surrounding education are unique, and so credit in these contexts may function very differently than in other contexts. In short, contextualism might provide a reply to Aizawa here.

For Fred Adams and Aizawa (2008), cognition requires the manipulation of representations with non-derived content. In "Extended Knowledge," Adams raises the following question: If extended knowledge is defined as a knowledge state that is partly constituted by entities that reach beyond the skull, are there any cases of extended knowledge that also meet Adams and Aizawa's cognition requirement? Adams argues that there is at least one potential case, viz. we-knowledge/we-intentions.

What we know is partially constituted by what we-intend and what we-intend is partially constituted by items in each other's heads. I suppose we could say that corresponding to we-intentions there exists we-knowledge. This is a way of knowing that exists in virtue of tracking one's intentions. In this case, the knowledge is joint, the intentions are joint, and the tracking is joint. So, if I am right, this constitutes a case of both extended cognition and extended knowledge -- the very item we've been stalking. (p. 87)

This is a surprising conclusion from someone who has diligently policed the boundaries of the mind for many years.

In "Extended Epistemology," Duncan Pritchard lays out his anti-luck virtue epistemology and argues that what is key to cases of extended knowledge is the integration of the external device into the agent's cognitive character. Pritchard then considers the threshold for extended knowledge on this account. According to his account, knowledge does not require intellectual virtue but cognitive ability, and therefore extended knowledge does not require intellectual virtue but an exercise of cognitive ability in which the technology is cognitively integrated. A child, for instance, could come to acquire perceptual knowledge through night vision glasses, and the cognitive integration of this technology would constitute an extended cognitive process, but it would not require that the child engage in any reflection on the process or exhibit epistemic virtues of any kind. Although the bar for anti-luck extended knowledge is quite low, Pritchard argues that there are reasons for demanding more of epistemic agents. Education, for instance, should not be merely passive. Understanding requires that the agent be active and engage in critical reflection. Therefore, demanding that extended knowledge exhibit epistemic virtues will often be beneficial. One of the merits of Pritchard's account of extended knowledge is its ability to capture animal knowledge, as well as the more reflective knowledge found in humans.

The smartphone is often used as an example of cognitive extension. In "Taking the iPhone Seriously: Epistemic Technologies and the Extended Mind" Isaac Record and Boaz Miller place this example under some careful scrutiny. They focus on a specific use of the smartphone -- navigation using the GPS feature while driving. Their thoughtful analysis of what actually happens when we use the GPS function on our phone is a welcome addition to the literature. Once the details are laid out it becomes pretty obvious that the smartphone doesn't meet the automatic trust criterion for extension in this case. Their general claim is that "checking" responsibilities are pervasive in our use of technology especially in high stakes contexts. According to Record and Miller, the trust criterion should be rejected and the extended mind thesis reconsidered.

In "Knowledge, Credit, and the Extended Mind, or what Calvisius Sabinas got Right," Michael Wheeler continues to explore the possibility of coupling extended mind with virtue epistemology. Wheeler starts with a credit condition on knowledge. Knowledge is the product of cognitive abilities. Virtues are cognitive abilities that allow us to get at the truth and avoid error. Knowledge attributions are credit attributions because we credit the person with truly believing that p because they have exercised their cognitive abilities in the right way. Where are the cognitive abilities that determine credit located? A cognitive internalist will say within the boundaries of the body; the extended cognition advocate will say beyond skin and bones. How can we arbitrate between these two views and also maintain the connection between knowledge and credit? Wheeler proposes that we link credit with ownership. Ownership, according to him, is "a matter of having the right kind of functional integration -- nothing more, nothing less" (p. 142). I've always thought the notion of ownership is under-theorized in epistemology. (After all, we have beliefs and reasons. What does it mean to have these things? Is it like owning something? Or is it more like having blue eyes?) For this reason, I find Wheeler's suggestion very compelling. But since cognitive integration has already been introduced as a way of identifying the boundaries of the mind, it isn't clear what additional role ownership is playing -- especially if ownership is defined in terms of "functional integration," as he suggests.

In "Extended Minds and Prime Mental Conditions: Probing the Parallels," Zoe Drayson compares and contrasts Williamson's argument for the indispensability of externalist propositional attitudes with Clark and Chalmers' argument for the indispensability of external mental states. In particular, she highlights the ways in which both include an appeal to explanatory generality. Drayson argues that, if the argument from explanatory generality works for Williamson's externalism, then ipso facto it should work for Clark and Chalmers' externalism. The reverse is also true, according to Drayson: if the argument from explanatory generality works for Clark and Chalmers' form of externalism, then it should also work for Williamson's form of externalism. This is a very helpful article in that it explores and explains two of the many, many forms of externalism in philosophy.

In "Reflective Knowledge: Knowledge Extended," Chienkuo Mi and Shane Ryan maintain the idea that reflection is necessary for a certain kind of knowledge and that extended knowledge requires reflective knowledge. They do so by considering a number of counterexamples to extended knowledge and argue that the only way to overcome these counterexamples is to acknowledge that reflection is needed for knowledge. They develop an account of reflection based on Confucianism and dual-process theory. This introduces an interesting integration of a certain form of epistemological internalism with extended knowledge. Reflective knowledge is required for the sort of coupling that makes for cognitive integration.

In Eric L. Hutton's "Extended Knowledge and Confucian Tradition," we get a more sustained discussion of the connections between extended knowledge and Confucianism. Hutton takes us through some of the work of the Confucian thinker, Xunzi. Xunzi seems to suggest that knowledge of the Way is a sort of extended knowledge that encompasses many generations of sages. Tradition is a reliable source of knowledge because it is the product of a collective process that has been honed across the ages. He compares this to recent claims that scientific research teams are the seat of collective knowledge. He notes, however, that in the case of the sages, there is a lack of reciprocal interaction. Such reciprocity is thought to be crucial for making the case that scientific research teams are themselves cognitive systems capable of producing knowledge. Hutton suggests that, although it limits cognitive bloat, the reciprocity condition may also limit the applicability of extended cognition in understanding larger social phenomena such as tradition. This may be a serious concern for those who are attracted to Shaun Gallagher's social externalism (2013).

Heather Battaly's "Extended Epistemic Virtue: Extended Cognition meets Virtue-Responsibilism" brings together extended cognition and virtue-responsibilism. Overall, this volume has a decidedly "virtue" slant, but it leans toward reliabilist versions of virtue epistemology. Battaly's insightful contribution explores the question of whether extended cognition might be compatible with virtue-responsibilism. One of the main differences between virtue-responsibilism and virtue-reliabilism is the way that they understand the virtues. For the reliabilist, stable cognitive faculties are paradigm examples of epistemic virtue. For the responsibilist, by contrast, virtues are character traits that are acquired and require "dispositions of epistemic motivation and epistemic action" (p. 196). Battalay argues that, in some ways, responsibilism and extended cognition are compatible in the sense that there seems to be no reason why certain extended cognitive processes couldn't count as responsibilist virtues. However, she raises a number of issues that point to an incompatibility. For instance, some putative extended cognitive systems are transient and this seems to conflict with virtue as a stable disposition, and virtue-responsibilism is often tied to internalist forms of justification which seem incompatible with extended cognition. She also considers ways in which virtue-responsibilism and extended cognition might fruitfully be combined. And here, like Adams and Hutton, she points to extension to other human beings rather than simply artifacts.

In "Cyborgs, Knowledge, and Credit for Learning," Ben Kotzee considers whether we should give credit to students who rely on technology. He argues that credit should not be awarded to agents because the technology is thoroughly integrated into one's cognitive character, but rather because agents have learned how to use the technology correctly. This seems to conflict with Clark and Chalmers' claim that Otto knows more than just how to find out where the museum is (by looking in his notebook), but knows that the museum is located on 53rd Street. Kotzee seems to be suggesting that extended knowledge is procedural rather than propositional.

In "Extended Knowledge, the Recognition Heuristic, and Epistemic Injustice," Mark Alfano and Joshua August Skorburg connect research on the recognition heuristic -- a specific type of cognitive bias -- and the embedded/scaffolded/extended mind thesis. They describe the differences between embedded, extended, and scaffolded cognition in the following way:

In cases of embedding, feedback to the environment from the cognitive agent is non-existent or spotty at best. In cases of scaffolding, feedback to the environment from the agent occurs, but efforts to rebuild or remold the environment require great effort, cleverness, and cooperation. In cases of outright extension, feedback between the environment and the agent is reliable in both directions. (p. 246)

Their focus is on the ways in which bias in the media contributes to the use of the recognition heuristic in consumers of media and to ill effects. They argue that the relationship between an agent and the media is best thought of in terms of scaffolding rather than extension. The media doesn't constitute an agent's knowledge but it is not entirely distinct from it. Consumers depend upon the media in various ways and can, in some cases, exert causal influence on the media. Cognitive scaffolds are often helpful as they decrease cognitive load, but they leave us epistemically vulnerable. "The recognition heuristic, as a form of scaffolded cognition, is subject to these kinds of vulnerabilities, and specifically to the Darfur Inference that because something is not recognized, it is not important or valuable" (p. 252). Alfano and Skorburg helpfully extend Miranda Fricker's concept of epistemic injustice to show that the media can play a significant role in silencing groups of people.

Richard Menary's contribution, "Keeping Track with Things," introduces the concept of "epistemic tracking tools," i.e., tools we use for perceiving and thinking about the world such as compasses, binoculars, maps and systems of representation. Menary argues that the development of these tools led humans to develop "enculturated" cognitive mechanisms in ontogeny. He goes on to consider the truth-tracking function of extended cultural systems and argues for a form of "responsible reliabilism." On this view, epistemic tools are reliable, but they also require cognitive diligence on the part of the user in order to produce cognitive success. Menary offers us an interesting mix of virtue theory and cognitive extension that might satisfy some internalist intuitions.

In his "Emerging Digital Technologies: Implications for Extended Conceptions of Cognition and Knowledge," Paul Smart considers some of the conditions for cognitive extension -- including accessibility, availability, trust, personalization, and reciprocity -- and how emerging digital technologies fare with respect to them. In particular, Smart focuses on our relationship to the internet and considers whether our interaction with it, and with future versions of it, meet the criteria for extension. This is an incredibly informative article about new technologies. It moves us beyond Otto's notebook and smartphones and will help put some meat on the bones of extended cognition examples. Our minds may not currently be "web-extended," but Smart makes a compelling case that, as technology advances, cognitive extension will seem less and less implausible.

In "New Humans? Ethics, Trust, and Extended Mind," Carter, Clark, and S. Orestis Palermos consider epistemic responsibility in light of extended mind/cyborg technology and raise some fascinating legal and moral questions. Consider, for instance, the issue of privacy. If your smartphone is part of your mind, our legal system will need to treat smartphones differently than mere property. Recent legal rulings regarding the search of smartphones appear to acknowledge this. Or consider the plausible claim that one's ethical, legal, and professional obligations are tied to what one knows. A lack of knowledge is often exculpatory. If I don't know how to perform CPR, I can't be held responsible for not administering it to a stranger in need. But if smartphones and their search engines constitute what we know, then our obligations would seem to expand considerably.

This anthology has a number of strengths. Taken together, the articles offer a sustained and focused discussion of the conditions for extension. The "trust and glue condition" and the notion of cognitive integration are critiqued or developed in various articles, and this offers the reader a comprehensive picture of the various counterexamples to the conditions and permutations the conditions have undergone in the literature. The volume focuses heavily on virtue theories of knowledge, but because of this, the connection between mind, agency, and responsibility is explored in fruitful and interesting ways. Finally, the articles offer a brutally honest and thorough assessment of the prospects of an extended epistemology. Indeed, one comes away from the volume with the view that, even if the mind or cognition is extended, extended knowledge doesn't come easy. My own view is that extension, both metaphysical and epistemological, is much more plausible when we consider extension to other minds, rather than to artifacts (Tollefsen 2005). Many of the articles in this volume seem to reinforce this position.

But because of its somewhat narrow focus on virtue theory (and, in particular, virtue- reliabilism), readers may be left wondering about other theories of knowledge/justification and their relationship to Clark and Chalmers' theses. Goldman-style reliabilist theories of justification (1979), for instance, seem well-suited for the extended cognition thesis, so long as one allows for reliable processes to extend beyond the skin and bones. Are tracking theories of knowledge (Nozick 1981) or safety conditions (Williamson 2000) compatible with extended mind or cognition? And because the focus is almost exclusively on Clark and Chalmers' theses, readers might also wonder what the prospects are for an extended epistemology if one adopted an approach that focuses more on complementarity rather than parity (e.g. Sutton et al. 2010), or if one endorsed an enactivist theory (Hutto 2012).

Of course, no volume can be expected to do it all, and this one already does quite a bit. Contemporary epistemology has remained, for the most part, agnostic about the metaphysics of mind. Epistemology, according to this way of thinking, can blissfully carry on without having to establish the nature of cognitive processes, what beliefs are, or where they are located. Coupled with the second volume on socially extended knowledge, this set provides a comprehensive discussion of how a particular metaphysics of mind impacts epistemological theorizing. It suggests pretty strongly that agnosticism is no longer an option. We can either accept or reject Clark and Chalmers' theses, but to do either commits us to a particular view concerning the nature of the processes and states about which epistemology theorizes. For scholars working on extended mind and epistemology, or for those interested in the meta-issue of the relationship between epistemology and metaphysics, this volume is essential reading.


Adams, F. and K. Aizawa. (2008). The Bounds of Cognition. Malden, MA and Oxford: Blackwell.

Clark, A. and D. Chalmers (1998). "The extended mind." Analysis 58 (1): 7-19.

Clark, A. (2008). Supersizing the Mind: Embodiment, Action, and Cognitive Extension. New York: Oxford University Press.

Gallagher, S. (2013). "The socially extended mind." Cognitive Systems Research, vol. 25-26: 4-12.

Goldman, A. (1979). "What Is Justified Belief?" in G.S. Pappas (ed.), Justification and Knowledge, Dordrecht: Reidel, pp. 1-25.

Hutto, D. (2012). Radicalizing Enactivism: Basic Minds without Content. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Nozick, R. (1981). Philosophical Explanations, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Smithies, D. (2012). "Moore's Paradox and the Accessibility of Justification." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 85 (2): 273-300.

Sutton, J., Harris, C. B., Keil, P. G., & Barnier, A. J. (2010). "The psychology of memory, extended cognition, and socially distributed remembering." Phenomenology and the Cognitive Sciences9(4): 521-560.

Tollefsen, D. (2006). "From extended mind to collective mind." Cognitive Systems Research 7 (2):140-150.

Williamson, T. (2000). Knowledge and Its Limits, Oxford: Oxford University Press.