Extended Rationality: A Hinge Epistemology

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Annalisa Coliva, Extended Rationality: A Hinge Epistemology, Palgrave Macmillan, 2015, 221pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137501882.

Reviewed by Martin Kusch, University of Vienna


Extended Rationality is an original and important contribution to the current debate over the structure of perceptual justification.

Take my current perceptual belief that

(*) I am seeing my computer screen in front of me.

All sides agree that two conditions have to be fulfilled for (*) to be epistemically justified. First, I must have an appropriate sensory experience. And second, I must not have defeaters for (*) (such as the information that my medication causes me to hallucinate).

Alas, this is where philosophical agreement ends. Liberals (like James Pryor) hold that the two mentioned conditions are jointly necessary and sufficient for (at least some) cases of perceptual justification. Anti-liberals disagree. They insist that a third condition has also to be met for beliefs like (*) to be justified: I must be allowed to make general assumptions such as that there is a mind-external world or that my eyes and brain work properly. Following Wittgenstein's On Certainty, Annalisa Coliva calls such general assumptions hinges. Hinges must be in place, anti-liberals insist, for our sensory experience to be evidence for the existence of mind-independent objects.

Anti-liberals come in two flavours, moderates and conservatives. They differ over the question of whether hinges can or must be epistemically warranted in turn. Conservatives answer positively. But they face an uphill struggle. For instance, attempts to empirically defend the existence of a mind-independent world are circular. And a priori arguments for the truth of hinges are hard to come by. This leaves Crispin Wright as the main conservative contender.

Wright suggests that we have unearned warrants for our hinges. That the warrants are unearned means that they are based neither on empirical evidence nor on a priori considerations. Wright's basic argument runs as follows. In order to successfully engage in any cognitive project, certain hinges have to be in place. If there is no good reason to assume that these hinges are false and if any attempt to justify these hinges involves a further cognitive project of the very same kind, then we are entitled to treat these hinges as warranted in an unearned way. (p. 66)

Moderates insist against liberals that hinges are necessary for perceptual justification and against conservatives that hinges are unwarrantable. Moderates are many: David Hume, Wittgenstein, some pragmatists and some externalists. Coliva distinguishes herself from other moderates by advocating a rationalist version of the doctrine.

Coliva develops her position primarily in answer to the Humean sceptic who denies that our hinges are warrantable or rational. The first step of Coliva's argument is to maintain that our notion of epistemic rationality is shared by both the (Humean) sceptics and the non-sceptics amongst us. This is because, second step, our epistemic rationality is grounded in our shared epistemic practices, and especially in our shared basic practice of forming and assessing beliefs, based on sensory experience, about what we take to be mind-independent objects. Third, this practice rests on assuming the truth of our hinges. Fourth, because hinges are the conditions of the possibility of our epistemic practice, they are also constitutive of epistemic rationality itself (p. 129). (Coliva notes the Kantian flavour of this step.) It follows, fifth, that Humean scepticism is defeated: it is based on a misconceived overly narrow conception of epistemic rationality. (p. 129)

To hammer home her point, Coliva likens our epistemic practice to a game with its constitutive rules. The Humean wants to play our epistemic game and still be a sceptic. That is, he wants to have evidential warrant for ordinary empirical propositions while refusing to see the hinges as rational. This is not possible. Whoever wants to be play our epistemic game has to accept its constitutive rules. (p. 131)

Coliva generalizes her argument for extending rationality to several other areas: to the problem of induction as well as to the epistemology of memory, testimony, and logic. We all play the game of making inductive judgements, and the principle of the uniformity of nature is essential to this game. Hence this principle is part and parcel of our inductive rationality. (p. 156) We all play the game of making judgements about the past, and the existence of the past and the reliability of our memory are essential to this game. Hence these ideas are part of our diachronic epistemic rationality. (pp. 158-159) We all play the game of reporting facts to each other, and the idea that informants are generally reliable is essential to this game. Hence this idea is part and parcel of our testimonial rationality. (p. 163) And finally, we all play the game of logic and the acceptance of unwarrantable basic and valid inference rules is essential to this game. Hence this idea is part and parcel of our deductive-epistemic rationality. (p. 177)

Coliva's rational moderatism has consequences for Closure and Transmission Failure. Consider the following two arguments (p. 86):


(I)          Here is a zebra;

(II)         If this is a zebra, then it is not a cleverly disguised mule;

(III)       This is not a cleverly disguised mule.


(I)          Here is a hand;

(II)         If there is a hand here, then there is an external world;

(III)       There is an external world.

Authors who find ZEBRA and MOORE wanting disagree over what makes these two arguments unsatisfactory. Robert Nozick and Fred Dretske famously argued that ZEBRA and MOORE violate the closure principle (i.e. that knowledge or warrant are closed under known or warranted entailment). I can know that here is a hand since I would continue believing it in nearby worlds, but I cannot know that what I see isn't a cleverly disguised mule: in the closest worlds in which what I see is a cleverly disguised mule I will not believe it to be a mule. Wright holds that the failure in MOORE and ZEBRA is one of transmission failure; in both arguments, (I) and (II) cannot transmit their warrant to (III) since for (I) to be warranted, (III) has to be independently warranted already. (p. 87)

Coliva suggests a second, new form of transmission failure. What is problematic about MOORE is that in order for (I) to be warranted, (III) must already be assumed to be true. The difference compared with Wright is important: Coliva is not talking about the warrant for (III) being necessary for the having warrant for (I); she is saying that (the truth of) (III) itself is necessary for having warrant for (I). (pp. 93-94) Note that this analysis falls directly out of moderatism with its central claim that hinges are not warrantable. If hinges are not warrantable then obviously they cannot transmit their warrant to (I). Moreover, Coliva can also now point to a difference between MOORE and ZEBRA: since (III) of ZEBRA is warrantable (by closer visual inspection, say), the transmission failure here is of the Wrightian kind, and not of the new (second) kind. (pp. 96-97)

Finally, Coliva points out that on her analysis of hinges, the closure principle for warrant fails when the conclusion (III) is a hinge. Warrant cannot transfer from the premises to the conclusion when the conclusion is unwarrantable. (pp. 101-102) Fortunately though, closure will remain in force for all conclusions that are warrantable.

Why should we prefer rationalist moderatism over its competitors?  Coliva's main criticism of liberalism is that sensory experience on its own does not take us beyond our mental states, beyond our cognitive locality. Only against the backdrop of our hinges can sensory experience be evidence for objects outside of the mind. (pp. 27-28) Coliva is also unhappy with Pryor's take on MOORE. Pryor holds that MOORE is fine as far as it goes, though dialectically ineffective against the sceptic (Pryor claims that the latter has doubts he shouldn't have). Coliva demurs by arguing that Moore's proof would be impotent even vis-à-vis an open-minded subject who considers the possibility of sceptical scenarios for the first time. (p. 59)

Against Wright's conservatism Coliva presents two objections. The first is the familiar complaint that Wright's entitlements are not epistemic but merely pragmatic:

they do not give us reasons for believing that it is true that we are not dreaming, or that there is an external world, but merely pragmatic reasons for acting as if things were so, since this would allow us to preserve our 'cognitive projects' that are chiefly useful and important to us. (p. 68)

Coliva's second argument is that Wright's entitlements are not on the same level as the sceptical challenge. Wright does not offer an unearned warrant for hinges themselves; he merely offers an unearned warrant for our right to assume them to be true. Contrary to his own self-understanding, Wright thereby turns out to be a moderate of sorts: after all, it is the moderates who propose that no warrants for hinges can be given. (pp. 68-71)

This is an impressive book. Together with her Moore and Wittgenstein (2010) it establishes Coliva as a leading voice at the intersection of epistemology and Wittgenstein-studies. I hasten to add that her work should be of interest not just for Wittgenstein scholars, but for epistemologists more generally.

I now turn to some brief objections.

First, I found it a little cumbersome that the criticism of Pryor and Wright is distributed over all five chapters. This procedure brings with it a considerable degree of overlap between chapters and a higher degree of redundancy than one would normally expect in a relatively short book. It might have been better to first develop the moderate position in all its glory and only then take on the opposition.

Second, Coliva's main interlocutor throughout the book is Wright. Alas, Wright is a moving target, and thus difficult to hit with objections and refutations. It seems to me that Coliva is not sufficiently sensitive to this problem. For instance, she repeatedly speaks of what she calls Wright's official position and uses this device to side-line ideas that do not fit with the position she rejects. I am particularly concerned that she has not taken the full measure of Wright's most recent reformulation of his position in "On Epistemic Entitlements (II): Welfare State Epistemology" (2014) (a paper listed in her references). Let me give an example. Coliva follows Duncan Pritchard (2005) and C. S. Jenkins (2007) in claiming that Wright's entitlements are pragmatic rather than epistemic. But in his 2014 paper Wright offers a detailed reply to this criticism. He distinguishes between two readings of pragmatic. The first is "merely pragmatic, as associated with resonances of opportunism and political compromiseThe second meaning of pragmatic is 'related to the goals of an agent'. Wright sees no tension between this second meaning and the realm of the epistemic. Pragmatic reasons are reasons "contingent on the goals of the agent", and sometimes these goals are epistemic.

Third, it is surprising that Coliva does not respond to Wright's 2012 criticism of her position. Wright writes:

if it really were constitutive of our conception of rational empirical enquiry to assume that there is an external material world, then there should be a kind of unintelligibility about a sceptical challenge to the rationality of this assumption which would be at odds with the sense of paradox created by the best sceptical arguments that challenge it. . . . A proponent of the third way needs to explain how features that are constitutive of our concept of rational enquiry can nevertheless be sufficiently opaque to those who have mastered the concept to be prima facie coherently questionable. (2012: 479)

This is Wright's first worry. The second concern rests on the view that the common core of different uses of "rational" in different cultures lies in the consequences of these uses rather than in a specific common content. This makes it unlikely that the rationality of the belief that the world exists is "part of what we mean by 'rational'". (2012: 480)

Fourth, Coliva's argument in defence of her extended-rationality view is a transcendental argument in all but name. Her brief mention of Kant (p. 129) shows that she is aware of this fact. Unfortunately, she does not develop the issue in sufficient depth. For instance, Strawson figures in her text only as the author of Scepticism and Naturalism (1985), but not as the author of transcendental arguments familiar from Individuals (1959) or The Bounds of Sense (1966). More worryingly, Coliva does not address the literature critical of such arguments. For instance, Barry Stroud (1968/2000) is not mentioned at all. And yet Stroud's classic attack applies at least prima facie also to Coliva's position. Stroud was targeting the idea that the truth of some proposition S is a necessary condition for the possibility of language. He observed that "the sceptic can always very plausibly insist that it is enough to make language possible if we believe that S is true, or that it looks for all the world as if it is, but that S needn't actually be true" (Stroud 2000: 24). Coliva argues that for our basic game of perception to be possible, the hinges have to be true. The Stroudian response would be that the sceptic can always very plausibly insist that it is enough to make that game possible that we believe that the hinges are true, or that it looks for all the world as if they are, but that the hinges needn't actually be true. I am at a loss as to what Coliva's answer would be.

Fifth, Coliva does however discuss another threat to her central argument: David Enoch's paper "Agency, Shmagency: Why Normativity Won't Come from What Is Constitutive of Action" (2006). I am not convinced, however, that Coliva has fully addressed Enoch's concern. She reduces the issue to the question whether we can opt out of our epistemic rationality. And she answers, first, that we can do so only at the price of a very short life, and second, that in any case, to play our epistemic game we have to play by epistemic rationality as she reconstructs it. I imagine the Enochian sceptic to reply as follows: 'Why should I care about being rational in your sense? Why shouldn't I be shmrational, that is, rational in your sense except that I accept no more than a psychological or sociological account for why the hinges are hinges for us? And if you tell me that I have in fact opted out of 'our' basic epistemic game for perception, then I am happy to be counted as playing a game of shmerception that is like your game of perception except that I do not share your view of the hinges as rational.'

Sixth, return to Coliva's main argument against Wright, that is, the accusation that Wright's reflections on entitlements only show that it is rational to assume that the hinges are true, but not that the hinges are true. The first question to ask is whether her approach does better. Her idea is that the truth of the hinges is part and parcel of our rationality. But what is it for a truth p to be part of, or a precondition of, a certain kind of rationality? How else is this to be understood if not as the idea that it is rationally obligatory or rationally permitted to take p to be true? The second question is whether Wright ever promises to deliver anything more demanding than that we have unearned warrants for our hinges, warrants that allow us to take them to be true (as long as we do not have evidence against them, and as long as any defence for them demands another cognitive project of the same kind). I am not sure that he does.

Seventh, Coliva holds that the strength of her proposal can be seen from the fact that it throws new light on transmission failure, on closure, as well as on the epistemology of induction, of memory, of testimony and of basic laws of logic (p. 17). I am not fully convinced. We need Coliva's new form of transmission failure only if we first grant her the idea that hinges are unwarrantable. The identification of a new form of transmission failure is thus not an independent support for her position; it presupposes a central plank of it. And with respect to the uniformity of nature as well as the hinges involved in memory, testimony, and logic, she does little more than repeat mutatis mutandis her familiar transcendental argument. Anyone sceptical about its use in the case of perceptual justification will not be convinced by its quick repetition in all the other mentioned areas.


For comments on a first draft I am grateful to Natalie Ashton, Gary Gutting and Martha Roessler.


Coliva, A. (2010), Moore and Wittgenstein: Scepticism, Certainty and Common Sense, London: Palgrave Macmillan.

Enoch, D. (2006), "Agency, Shmagency: Why Normativity Won't Come from What Is Constitutive of Action", Philosophical Review 115/2: 169-198.

Jenkins, C. (2007), "Entitlement and Rationality", Synthese, 157/1: 25-45.

Pritchard, D. (2005), "Wittgenstein's On Certainty and Contemporary Anti-scepticism", in D. Moyal-Sharrock and W. H. Brenner (eds.), Readings of Wittgenstein's On Certainty, London: Palgrave, 189-224.

Strawson, P. (1959), Individuals: An Essay in Descriptive Metaphysics, London: Methuen.

--  --  --  --  -- - (1966), The Bounds of Sense: A Essay on Kant's 'Critique of Pure Reason', London: Methuen.

--  --  --  --  -- - (1985), Scepticism and Naturalism: Some Varieties, New York: Columbia University Press.

Stroud, B. (1968/2000), "Transcendental Arguments", in B. Stroud (2000), Understanding Human Knowledge: Philosophical Essays, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 9-25.

Wittgenstein, L. (1969), On Certainty, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.

Wright, C. (2012), "Replies", in A. Coliva (ed.), Mind, Meaning, & Knowledge, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 377-486.

--  --  --  --  -- - (2014), "On Epistemic Entitlement (II): Welfare State Epistemology", in D. Dodd and E. Zardini (eds.), Scepticism and Perceptual Justification, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 213-247.