Extending Ourselves: Computational Science, Empiricism, and Scientific Method

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Paul Humphreys, Extending Ourselves: Computational Science, Empiricism, and Scientific Method, Oxford University Press, 2004, 182pp, $47.50 (hbk), ISBN 0195158709.

Reviewed by Paul Thagard, University of Waterloo


This book is an excellent philosophical appraisal of the roles played by computers in modern science. It discusses such computational methods as computer simulations, Monte Carlo methods, and agent-based modeling, making many important points about empiricism, realism, and epistemology in general. Its conclusions are defended by a rich set of scientific examples mostly taken from physics. I shall assess the conclusions according to how well they fit with the use of computational models in the two fields in which I have employed them myself, psychology and neuroscience.

Here are what seem to me to be the most important conclusions for which Humphreys argues. Scientific knowledge is not limited to what human senses can provide, because the senses can be augmented by instruments and new forms of mathematics. Instruments are property detectors, and we often have good grounds for believing that they succeed in detecting properties not directly observable. Just as instruments extend human observation, so computability extends the realm of mathematical representations. Physical science requires tractable mathematics to provide the connection between theory and application, and computation increasingly provides such mathematics because calculations are too complex to be conducted by humans alone. Computational models may be literally false, but they may still capture much about observed phenomena. Simulations are widely used to explore mathematical models that are analytically intractable. None of the favorite syntactic or semantic representations of philosophers capture what simulations do. Computer simulations have many advantages, including reduction in the degree of idealization required in a model, and greater flexibility, precision and replicability in its application. Computational devices are the numerical analogues of empirical instruments. The use of simple mechanisms is acceptable for purposes of understanding only if there is good reason to hold that they correspond to genuine features of the systems under investigation. Computer models can be hindered by "epistemic opacity" when a computational process is too fast for humans to follow in detail, or when there is no explicit algorithm linking inputs to outputs.

Humphreys defends these conclusions mostly with examples from research in physics, but they also fit well with current practice in the cognitive sciences. Psychology and neuroscience both go well beyond what the senses can provide, thanks to instrumental techniques such as reaction-time measurements, single-cell recordings, electroencephalography, positron-emission tomography, and magnetic-resonance imaging. Such techniques provide much deeper information about how minds and brains work than introspective observations, and often provide strong evidence that introspection is unreliable. For example, people's reports that they are not racially prejudiced are sometimes contradicted by reaction-time experiments that show that they associate particular races with negative stereotypes, and by brain-scanning experiments that identify strong activation of fear mechanisms in response to pictures of people of particular races. Cognitive science is at its strongest when behavioral evidence meshes with evidence from neurological science. When such meshing occurs, we can have reasonable grounds to believe that instruments are detecting properties that introspection would never identify.

Just as experiments extend observation, computation extends calculation in cognitive science. Unlike theories in physics, theories in psychology and neuroscience rarely take the form of small sets of equations like Newton's laws of motion and gravitation. Rather, they consist of specification of mechanisms consisting of relations and interactions among the objects that lead to systematic changes. In theoretical psychology for most of the past 40 years, the key objects are mental representations such as rules, concepts, and images, and the interactions are specified by algorithmic computational procedures. In theoretical neuroscience, the key objects are neurons and neural groups, and the interactions are specified by biological procedures such as excitation and inhibition. In current research, cognitive mechanisms are increasingly being associated with neural ones. The mechanical systems postulated by psychology and neuroscience are far too complicated for their consequences to be worked out by unaided deductions, so that computer simulations are essential to link theories with phenomena, just as Humphreys maintains for physics.

However, there is a crucial difference between computational models in physics and cognitive science. No one thinks that planets or falling objects are actually doing computation. Rather, computational models are useful for deriving the consequences of the mathematical formulae that describe the behavior of planets and falling objects. In cognitive science, models have the same use, but they also have a more central theoretical role, by virtue of the currently dominant view that what minds and brains do is in fact a kind of computation. Theoretical biology appears to be intermediate between physics and cognitive science, in that computer models in evolutionary theory do not describe individuals and species as actually computing, but mechanistic theories in molecular biology sometimes assume that all cells, not just neurons, are computers. If such views are correct, and there are many reasons to believe that they are at least for psychology and neuroscience, then the theoretical role of computation is even larger than the calculation-enhancing role that Humphreys describes for physics.

Psychological and neurological theories are not well characterized syntactically as formulas or semantically as set-theoretical structures; rather they are represented cognitively by a variety of mental and external representations that incorporate both syntax and semantics, including visual representations such as diagrams as well as verbal representations. Like maps, computer models do not give a full description of the reality they are supposed to depict, but they can provide good approximations to the most important objects, relations, and interrelations that produce the phenomena they are intended to explain. Computer simulations have all the advantages in cognitive science that Humphreys ascribes to them in physics: flexibility, precision and replicability. Simulations in psychology and neuroscience provide precise ways to characterize the mechanisms hypothesized to produce mental phenomena, and they flexibly allow the replicable determination of the consequences of different variations of those mechanisms. It therefore seems fair to conclude, for cognitive science just as Humphreys does for physics, that computer modeling provides enhancements to human calculation that are analogous to what instrumentation provides to human observation.

Humphreys seems to have doubts about some of the uses of computer models in economics and psychology, when they use mechanisms too simple or obscure to be plausibly operating in the systems studied. I think these worries are legitimate for much current "agent-based" modeling in economics, in which the agents are even more psychologically impoverished than the ones employed in current microeconomic theories. The solution is to produce computer models of economic groups in which the individuals are much more psychologically realistic in that they possess something of the cognitive and emotional capabilities of the humans they are supposed to model. Similarly, the problem that arose with 1980s-style connectionist models -- that they produced somewhat opaque results through biologically implausible mechanisms such as backpropagation learning algorithms -- is avoided by current neural network models that are much more closely tied to structures and processes that are known to operate in human brains.

Although Humphrey's book is in general an excellent philosophical discussion of the role of computational models in physics, I suspect that even there it underestimates the importance of explanation compared to prediction. In psychological and neuroscience, computation is used in prediction, but the primary role is in explanation by showing how postulated mechanisms can generate phenomena. Similarly, in evolutionary and molecular biology, predictions are rather fairly rare, but explanations abound of how complex mechanisms can produce changes in populations, individuals, organs, and cells. Physics is better at making precise predictions than biology or psychology, but it is still concerned with explanation: we want to know why the planets go around the sun. However, it is a supplement not a correction to Humphreys' fine book to point out that computer models play a substantial role in explanation as well as calculation