Externalism, Self-Knowledge, and Skepticism: New Essays

Placeholder book cover

Sanford C. Goldberg (ed.), Externalism, Self-Knowledge, and Skepticism: New Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 263pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107063501.

Reviewed by Earl Conee, University of Rochester


The book comprises an introduction and thirteen essays. The essays address the bearing on self-knowledge of externalism about mental content. I will sketch the themes of eleven of the papers and then comment on aspects of the other two.

"Some questions about Burge's 'self-verifying judgments'" is by the late Tony Brueckner. The volume is dedicated to his memory. Brueckner's paper responds to an objection by Finn Spicer to Tyler Burge's claim that certain judgments about what one is thinking are self-verifying. The claim is intended to identify something about knowledge of one's own thought contents that is both epistemically special and compatible with content externalism. Brueckner's defense of Burge's claim is characteristically lucid and rigorous. It is a keen reminder of philosophy's loss.

Two papers continue their authors' discussion of a theory of concepts by Mark Sainsbury and Michael Tye. In "Further thoughts on the transparency of mental content" Paul Boghossian charges that the theory mistakenly allows as rational certain people who, by the theory of concepts, believe simple logical contradictions and make simple logically invalid inferences.

In "Counting concepts: response to Paul Boghossian" Sainsbury and Tye reply that the relevant people are not disqualified from being rational by the theory's implications of their holding contradictory beliefs and making the invalid inferences. The people have good excuses of familiar sorts for the beliefs and the inferences.

Two papers apply fairly new philosophical tools. In "Contrastive self-knowledge and the McKinsey paradox" Sarah Sawyer applies contrastivism about knowledge to Michael McKinsey's paradox about content externalism and self-knowledge. The contrastivism is the view that propositional knowledge relates a person to a proposition contrasted with certain other propositions. The application concerns an apparent conflict, first presented by McKinsey, among roughly the following three theses: one can have non-empirical knowledge of one's thought contents; some of one's thought contents are partly determined by contingent aspects of one's environment; and one does not have non-empirical knowledge of any contingent aspect of one's environment. The paper argues that bringing contrastivism to bear on the knowledge of thought contents reveals the invalidity of an argument from knowledge of thought contents and externalism, to knowledge of empirical information.

In "Externalism, self-knowledge and memory" Jordi Fernandez applies a two-dimensional semantics to criticize a memory argument against externalism. The pertinent 2-D semantics is roughly the view that ordinary mental content attributions can attribute contents of both subjective and objective sorts. The memory argument involves a subject having a memory, when the subject's environment may have been switched for all the subject knows, together with the assumption that knowledge requires excluding all relevant alternatives. The conclusion is that externalism implies a lack of knowledge of the contents of current thoughts. Fernandez's paper replies that for the externalist content, the objective content of the memory, the subject does meet the requirement for knowledge of excluding the relevant alternatives. The paper proposes that confusion between the objective and subjective content is responsible for the appearance that externalism implies that relevant alternatives cannot be excluded.

Henry Jackman's "Externalism, metasemantic contextualism, and self-knowledge" employs a context-relative interpretive holism to mental state ascription. The view aims to maximize true belief ascription that is weighted by the subject's priorities among beliefs. Jackman argues that this sort of view can answer objections to externalism involving switches in the subject's environment, both unwitting environmental changes that do affect the subject's mental contents, according to externalism, and witting changes that only seem to affect the content, according to externalism.

Jussi Haukioja's "Externalism, metainternalism, and self-knowledge" invokes metainternalism in defense of mental content externalism. Metainternalism is the view that whether a subject's mental content is internally or externally determined is itself determined by something internal to the subject. Haukioja proposes that the internal determiners are the subject's dispositions to apply her concepts. Haukioja holds that this dispositionalist metainternalism supports a reply by Brian McLaughlin and Tye to an anti-externalist argument. The argument contends that content externalism implies, implausibly, that we can have knowledge by introspection of our environment. The reply is that the implied knowledge, concerning an externally determined concept, is only knowledge that the concept 'aims' to have application to an environmental natural kind. The externalism does not imply that the aim is successful. Haukioja holds that the dispositionalist metainternalism explains how the externalism that it supports allows knowledge of the aim, but not knowledge of anything more environmental.

Brie Gertler's "Internalism, externalism, and accessibilism" identifies the main disagreement between internalists and externalists about mental content as an issue concerning the cognitive value of thoughts and concepts. The paper contends that higher-order facts about self-knowledge of thoughts and concepts do not resolve the issue. Instead Gertler advocates making progress by considering the first-order rational roles of contents. She advocates Differential Dubitability, a principle for individuating mental contents. DD distinguishes contents only when there is some potential difference in the subject's credence in the contents. Gertler argues that DD faults externalism.

Gary Ebbs' "On knowing what thoughts one's utterances express" advocates Minimalism about Minimal Self-Knowledge. Having some minimal self-knowledge is knowing what one's utterance means. Minimalism about this is roughly the view that minimal self-knowledge requires only an ability to use (and not merely mention) a sentence uttered in inquiries concerning its truth. Consequently, minimal self-knowledge does not require any meta-linguistic propositional knowledge of what the sentences mean. The paper includes a response to an objection against Minimalism about Minimal Self-Knowledge that Ebbs derives from work by Gareth Evans. The objection contends roughly that understanding a sentence with a proper name requires, beyond minimal self-knowledge, being able to single out the name's referent in other terms. Ebbs finds reason to reject this further requirement and no good reason to accept it.

Sanford C. Goldberg's "Anti-individualism, comprehension, and self-knowledge" gives examples that he presents as routine instances of testimonial knowledge acquisition. In the examples recipients of testimony have, at best, a relatively limited understanding of what they hear. For instance, someone who previously knew nothing of baseball is told, while watching a first game, that "it is the top of the ninth inning." Goldberg contends that since knowledge is acquired from such testimony, the recipients comprehend the propositions sufficiently to have them as thought contents. Goldberg observes that this sufficiency conflicts with any internalist requirement that we have an ability to explicate our thought contents.

├ůsa Wikforss' "The insignificance of transparency" argues that the best way to understand what divides internalists from externalists is not a dispute over a transparency thesis, i.e., a thesis to the effect that identity and difference of mental content is always either known or available to be known by the subject. Wikforss argues that the fundamental dispute instead concerns whether or not content individuation derives only from what is needed to explain the subject's reasoning and actions. Internalism affirms this derivation and externalism denies it.

Here are comments on parts of the other two papers in the volume.

Crispin Wright's "Self-knowledge: the reality of privileged access" is an extensive response to some objections from Paul Snowdon. The objections address previous work by Wright on self-knowledge. The paper contains many helpful clarifications.

The paper makes an important proposal. It asserts that we know ourselves to have our current phenomenal states, when we meet a certain competence condition:

CK: "Necessarily, if phenomenal condition C applies to S and S possesses the relevant concepts and is in no condition that would impair their exercise in judgment, then S will know that C applies to him/her." (67)

CK's antecedent requirements of relevant concept possession and unimpaired judgment avoid trouble from some examples that Snowdon describes. CK has another problem that seems readily avoidable. CK's antecedent does not imply that S exercises the relevant concepts and forms an unimpaired judgment. Some such belief is needed to have the knowledge. It fixes this just to have the antecedent also require making the judgment.

CK raises another concern. CK makes no room for the possibility of misleading defeaters. It might be that a misleading defeater could undercut our justification for attributing a phenomenal condition to ourselves. I might feel pain, and judge that I do, while I have been given impressive evidence for this: psychological research has revealed that there is a mere illusion of pain in my current special circumstances. Perhaps, given this evidence, my judgment that I feel pain is not well enough justified for it to be knowledge. If it does remain well enough justified, then our being in a phenomenal condition like pain must override misleading evidence about its absence, no matter how credible the latter evidence can be. If so, why?

In "Luminosity and the KK thesis" Robert Stalnaker defends this principle:

KK: If S knows X, then S is in a position to know that S knows X.

Stalnaker criticizes an argument against KK that he attributes to Timothy Williamson. Stalnaker also presents a simple information-theoretic model of knowledge that confirms KK. He argues that although real human knowledge is more complicated than the simple model, our knowledge confirms KK too.

It seems to me that Stalnaker does not quite convey Williamson's anti-KK argument. Both arguments rely on a Margin of Error principle about knowledge. But Williamson's ME principle is different. I will object to Williamson's argument below. I think that the problem shows that nothing like Williamson's argument works.

Stalnaker attributes to Williamson an anti-KK argument that assumes that a subject knows this ME principle:

ME1: If S has a way to detect, within a certain margin of error, a magnitude N, and S knows that N is at least x, then N is in fact at least x+y, where y is a small fraction of the subject's margin of error for N.

For a reason that Stalnaker gives, assuming a subject's knowledge of ME1 is objectionable. Suppose that N1 is at the lowest limit of the magnitudes allowed by the margin of error. This can give the subject knowledge that the magnitude is at least N1. Yet N1 is within the margin of error. So, for all that the subject knows, the magnitude is exactly N1. The subject definitely does not know the manifest implication of the knowledge of N1 and ME1 that the magnitude is at least N1+y. Thus, assuming the subject's knowledge of ME1 is unacceptable.

Williamson's argument employs an example involving the notoriously nearsighted Mr. Magoo.[1] In the example Magoo sees a tree that is 666 inches tall. Magoo can see well enough to tell that it is not 60 or 6000 inches tall. But his vision does not nearly enable him to tell the tree's height to within a two-inch range. He has no other source of information about the tree's height. Magoo knows all of this about himself. Williamson uses these facts to support two things, an ME principle:

ME2: If the tree is i+1 inches tall, then Mr. Magoo does not know that the tree is not i inches tall,

and the assumption that Magoo knows ME2:

Ii: Mr. Magoo knows that if the tree is i+1 inches tall, then he does not know that the tree is not i inches tall.

Contraposing ME2 makes it easier to understand:

CME2: If Mr. Magoo knows that the tree is not i inches tall, then the tree is not i+1 inches tall.

ME2 appears safe to assume, understood on its own or via CME2. In support of ME2, nearsighted Magoo's knowing that the height is not a certain number of inches seems to require that the actual height is many more than just one inch different (though this will be contested below). The knowledge of ME2 that is attributed to Magoo by Ii also appears safe to assume. Magoo knows that his vision has a margin of error that is much greater than a two-inch range. What Ii says appears to require nothing more than that Magoo knows a clear consequence of his visual limitations.

Williamson uses Ii in an ingenious argument against KK. The argument starts with Magoo's knowledge of a height, zero inches, that even Magoo can tell by looking is not the tree's height. The argument goes first to an implication of KK, Ii, and other safe stipulations about the case. The implication is that Magoo knows that the height is not one inch taller than zero inches. This knowledge is implied because, by Ii, Magoo knows that the tree isn't just one inch taller than any height in inches that Magoo knows that tree does not have, such as zero inches. By 665 iterations of this reasoning, the argument reaches the reductio implication that Magoo knows the height not to be the tree's actual height, 666 inches.

Williamson contends that KK is the only suspect assumption. I contend that Magoo's knowledge of his visual limits undercuts Ii. Magoo can know that the tree is not zero inches tall. He can know that just by looking. The same goes for the negative height conclusions in the first few hundred iterations of the reasoning. He has no reason to doubt that he knows that heights that low are wrong. He can know that he knows. The implications of KK here are all unproblematic. But at some point the "i+1" value enters the range of heights that even Magoo's visual capacity constrains the tree's height to lie within. Magoo need not know anything like his exact visual margin of error. Perhaps Magoo knows his visual margin of error only within some very vaguely identified range. Still, at some point the reasoning reaches some i value where Magoo first definitely has good reason to think that the blurry range within which the tree's height lies might include i+1. When this point is reached, Magoo's basis for the conclusion that the tree is not i+1 inches tall has a defeater. The defeater is the chance, from Magoo's perspective, that the tree's height is i+1 inches.

The existence of this defeater refutes Ii. For all Magoo knows at this point, he has knowledge that the tree is not i inches tall, while the tree is in fact i+1 inches tall. Again, the i+1 value is a height that is in the range that he has reason to think that his vision might constrain the height to lie within. He has no way to exclude that height. Yet ME2 implies that the height is not i+1. So at least when Magoo reaches this point, Magoo does not know ME2. Magoo does not have the knowledge that Ii attributes to him.

This flaw in the argument seems irreparable. A refutation of KK tells us that there is an instance in which a subject knows, but the subject is not in a position to know that it is knowledge. Magoo-like examples are not promising sources of such instances. Suppose that a subject like Magoo knows some fact about some magnitude, although the subject knows himself or herself to have a margin of error for the magnitude. Something enables such a subject nonetheless to know that fact. Whatever gives this knowledge, despite the known margin of error, is available as an adequate basis for the subject to count it as knowledge.

A more promising sort of objection to KK cites subjects who have no reason to doubt a proposition, but do have misleading reason to doubt knowing it. We might have good enough justification to know some everyday fact, while having rational support for a plainly unmet justification condition on the knowledge which is in fact overly strong -- say, the condition that only indefeasible evidence justifies. Since the rationally supported condition is plainly unmet by our justification of the everyday fact, this renders unjustified for us the proposition that we know the everyday fact. Yet it leaves intact our justification for that fact, which is actually adequate. Thus, contrary to KK, we know the everyday fact while being in no position to know that we know.

At the end of his paper Stalnaker defends KK by appeal to some reasonable observations that rely on a knowledge requirement for proper assertion. It would be worth considering how that sort of defense of fares in light of the apparent possibility of people who do know, even though they have justified doubts that it qualifies as knowledge.

[1] Timothy Williamson, Knowledge and Its Limits, Oxford University Press, 2000, 115-116.