Eye for an Eye

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William Ian Miller, Eye for an Eye, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 266pp., $28.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521856809.

Reviewed by Jeffrie G. Murphy, Arizona State University


This is not a book in academic philosophy. Miller is a cultural historian, in particular a writer who has for years been immersed in the study of revenge cultures, and one should thus not expect to find in this book the kind of philosophical analyses and arguments that a reader of this journal might reasonably expect.

Why then bother to review the book in a journal devoted to philosophy? The answer is to be found in the fact that contemporary concepts and norms of interest to philosophers often come to us still trailing, in ways we are often unwilling to recognize, their distant historical antecedents -- antecedents that may be required for a full understanding and evaluation of those concepts and norms. Just as the concept of absolute human rights depends, in my view, on the religious framework in which it was originally imbedded, so may many of our ideas of retributive justice -- or even justice in general -- depend on ideas of revenge, of paying back, of getting even -- ideas that most contemporary philosophers want to reject as primitive, irrational, and even evil. Miller's book is an attempt to explore these historical cultural origins, to argue that -- once these origins are fully understood -- we should view them far more sympathetically than we generally do, and to maintain that in many ways these ideas are to be welcomed when retained in contemporary thought and practice.

Perhaps because he is unaware that some contemporary philosophers have linked justice with revenge and have seen some virtues in vindictiveness and vengeance,1 Miller has an irritating way of portraying himself as a lone voice crying in the wilderness -- one of the few contemporary writers who is not captive to a pious and sentimental rejection of anything that even smacks of revenge:

In some small way [this book] is my revenge on academic discussions of justice that have painted revenge as an unnuanced Vice in a morality play. Too often these discussions have the oppressive style of complacent and predictable sermonizing: lip service to, or defenses of, various safely proper positions. Would that academics had the knowledge (and irony) of a middling singer of an heroic tale. … I care about what people thought, what they actually did, what they wrote, and the stories they told, not just yesterday, but 2,500 years ago. My themes cannot be reduced to a single encapsulable thesis. People are too smart and too inventive, the variability of daily experience too complex, to be so easily cabined. If a characterization of the book's genre is required, it is best seen as an historical and philosophical meditation on paying back and buying back -- a meditation, that is, on retaliation and redemption. (p. x)

In spite of the hubris contained in Miller's description of his project, the book is well worth reading for any philosopher interested in justice -- particularly compensatory and retributive justice. It is informative, uniformly well written, often stimulating (even when this reader finds himself in disagreement), and frequently very entertaining and funny. I was engaged by it and found that it sometimes prodded me into thinking more deeply than I previously had about certain aspects of the practice of criminal punishment and topics related to that practice.

In spite of its many virtues, Miller's book is very difficult for a philosopher to review in a standard way because, as Miller himself notes in the passage quoted above, this is a book of assorted themes and -- except for the general negative thesis "don't think ill of revenge" -- it does not have a single unifying thesis for which philosophical arguments are developed. He ranges over so many topics, indeed, that one could not possibly discuss them all in a brief review. I will therefore assume that I was asked to write this review because of my work on the philosophy of crime and punishment -- a topic that naturally comes to mind whenever the phrase "an eye for an eye" is used -- and thus I will limit my review to those aspects of Miller's book that have a strong bearing on punishment, particularly punishment as retribution.

Limiting myself to punishment will of necessity cause me to avoid detailed discussion of other important topics richly dealt with in the book -- for example, the relationship that the principle "an eye for an eye" bears to the kind of evaluation that is associated with money: lives, bodies and body parts as money; money accepted or rejected as substitutes for lives, bodies, and body parts; and -- more generally -- when money is acceptable payback and when it is not. Miller's rich discussion of Shylock in Shakespeare's Merchant of Venice, for example, is imbedded in this context and would, I think, provide rich material for a philosopher of contract or tort law. Even this material is not utterly irrelevant to the philosophy of punishment, however, since retributive punishment is often described -- whether rightly or wrongly -- as a debt that the criminal owes to his victim or to the community as a whole.

Most (but not all, see note 1) philosophers who defend retributive theories of punishment -- philosophers from Kant to Michael Moore -- insist that what they call retribution -- giving wrongdoers what they deserve -- must be sharply distinguished from such unsavory or even evil practices as revenge or vengeance. They also want to insist, as a point in moral psychology, that the motivation that prompts one toward retribution is a sense of justice, something admirable, whereas the motivation that prompts one toward revenge or vengeance is vindictiveness, something quite vile -- some primitive and savage emotion that civilized people have outgrown.

Miller believes that this sharp distinction between retributive justice and revenge cannot be maintained and that those who seek to maintain it have a grossly uninformed view about the nature of revenge -- a view they would not have if they actually knew something about revenge cultures instead of starting with a variety of ignorant assumptions about such cultures:

The whole distinction [philosophical literature] mobilizes between retribution and revenge is untenable given any serious account of revenge as actually instituted in revenge cultures. Invariably, revenge is caricatured as a crazy, imbalanced response to injury. No real revenge culture would put up with this kind of revenge for a second. (p. 206)

If Miller is correct in expressing doubts about a sharp retribution/revenge distinction (and I think he is) why does the distinction seem so tempting to so many people? I think that the villain here may be the arts (particularly literature and film) and their tendency to portray revenge as dangerous madness. Crazy cases are without doubt the most interesting and gripping, but this hardly makes them paradigms for non-aesthetic purposes.

Consider Medea. (Miller uses the story of Michael Kohlhaas in the von Kleist novella for a similar purpose, but I use Medea because her story is simpler and readers are more likely to be familiar with the Euripides play.) Medea, of course, clearly acts excessively and viciously in taking her revenge -- murdering her children being quite out of proportion as retaliation even against a husband who has been guilty of marital infidelity and who has dishonored her in other ways. And it is probably examples such as Medea that make some people in fact feel guilty or ashamed of their own vindictive feelings, of their own acts of revenge, or even of taking delight when some misfortune befalls by chance a person by whom one has been wronged. For if one takes Medea's excesses to be a paradigm of vindictiveness and revenge taking, one will of necessity see these as irrational and evil -- even as insane -- and will conclude that there is nothing whatsoever that could possibly be said on their behalf, that they could not be a part of any system that we could coherently think of as a system of morality or justice.

This, argues Miller, is a great mistake. If we seriously study actual cultural practices of revenge, instead of simply subscribing to various sentimental clich├ęs and slogans, we will see that they often reveal complex rational and moral structures and indeed often reveal values that we ourselves at least once did accept and perhaps should accept again. Two such values are equality and honor.

At its most basic level, demanding an eye for an eye (even when not taken in a totally literal sense) is a way of revealing that one takes equality seriously and oneself seriously as a person of at least approximately equal worth with that of the person by whom one has been wronged. Suppose you have, by wronging me, brought me low. How can equality -- or even my own self respect as a being of equal status -- be maintained if this imbalance is allowed to stand uncorrected? In the absence of some controversial and perhaps otherworldly beliefs (being equal in the eyes of God perhaps) it is hard to see how it can. And one way to correct it is to have the wrongdoer himself brought low -- either by me or by the law taking on my persona and the personae of other similar victims -- so that the wrongdoer stands not above me but with me -- equal again in our eyes and in the eyes of others, equal on the scales of justice. Thus getting even in this sense requires taking the word "even" very seriously (Miller rightly pays close attention to the words we use and has a fascinating discussion of the scale metaphor); and, as Miller notes, certain practices of getting even can produce another value most of us value: peace. Restored to equality, my resentment may fade and allow me to work again with the person who wronged me so that we can once more reap the benefits of social cooperation -- perhaps the kind of secular "redemption" of which Miller earlier spoke. Proper proportionality is central to all this, and thus Medea -- rather than being a paradigm example of the virtues involved in revenge -- must be condemned by any person seriously committed to the law of the talion (lex talionis). ("Talion," as Miller reminds us, is from the Latin root of our word "retaliate" and has nothing whatsoever to do with the talons of large predatory birds.) Surely the original spectators at the Euripides play were not expected to admire Medea any more than we are inclined to admire her for her acts of excessive horror.

Seeing getting even as located in a framework organized under a concept of equality is not, of course, to demonstrate that vindictiveness and revenge (or this particular concept of equality) are beyond criticism. It does, however, demonstrate that these feelings and practices must be criticized in more subtle and nuanced ways than by the simplistic claim that they are inherently irrational and evil -- so beyond the pale that they could not form a part of any coherent system of value.

One might, of course, concede that equality of some sort is a value but -- given that so many different things can be meant by the word "equality" -- express doubts that the concept of equality to which revenge appeals is the best sort or even a good sort of equality. These doubts are not unreasonable, and so the concept of equality in question -- which can hardly be taken as of self-evident value -- requires location in a wider and deeper evaluative framework.

Miller sees this framework provided by the value of honor and best illustrated in cultures ("honor cultures") in which the value of honor is central. In such a culture, shame, in the eyes of others and in one's own eyes, is a powerful motivational force -- even more powerful than guilt. (I am reminded here of Bernard Williams' discussion of such cultures in his rich Shame and Necessity.) Persons (at least persons of a certain sort) will necessarily place great weight on status and on what is owed to a person as a result of the status that he occupies -- not just in the present but also as he will be remembered by his culture in song, poetry, and legend. In the most appealing cases, this status will be a function not merely of such things as family connections but of actual merit in activities highly useful to the community -- skill as a warrior, for example.

Ancient Greece was largely an honor culture of this kind and viewed an affront to honor as a function of the victim's status with respect to the status of the offending party. Thus the treatment that was owed to Achilles, for example, was quite different from the treatment that was owed to an ordinary foot soldier. An ordinary foot soldier, indeed, was so beneath Achilles in status that it is hard to imagine how the soldier could wrong or offend Achilles in a way that would make Achilles want to get even since the concept of getting even in this case would hardly make sense. The soldier would be a mere irritant, not a force of possible insult, and Achilles would probably brush him off or step on him much in the way that he might an insect -- or perhaps simply lead a round of laughter at the soldier's expense. Being wronged by an Agamemnon, however, would be -- as the saying goes -- quite a different kettle of fish.

Our current politically correct American academic culture -- a culture I have elsewhere characterized as "egalitarianism on steroids" -- claims to be highly suspicious of status (except for that of its own professoriate, of course) and is, for example, often -- in administering academic programs -- willing to admit and even graduate near morons under some vague and sentimental notion of equality. Terrified (and understandably so) by the fact that wrongly placed deference to status of the wrong sort has in the past led to some serious injustices, many are now reluctant to accord deference to any status at all -- even status conferred by obvious desert. The writer Florence King recently reflected on Thomas Jefferson's concept of a "natural aristocracy" and said that if such an idea were put forward today there would be cries of "everybody has a right to be a natural aristocrat," natural aristocrat support groups, and a natural aristocrat hot line. I fear that her cynicism is not totally misplaced.

Perhaps it was not always this way even in America. As Gordon Wood has recently argued (in his Revolutionary Character: What Makes the Founders Different) Washington, Jefferson and most of the other founders (Aaron Burr being the notable exception) had a conception of themselves as members of a kind of intellectual and moral aristocracy -- justified in having political power because of their intellectual and moral merits, highly conscious of their honor (in a Greek and Roman sense), deeply concerned with their place in history (song, poetry, and legend), and (fortunately) believing that their status -- a high status at that time generally recognized and respected by most citizens -- conferred upon them an obligation to promote the common good and secure their place in history by accomplishing that goal while maintaining at least a public image of comparative indifference to money and to power for its own sake. Aaron Burr -- a man of greed and narrow self-promotion -- was more like one of our contemporaries. According to Wood, the rise of populist egalitarian democracy resulted in the rejection of this kind of right to rule by status -- a result that was, ironically, brought about by some of the very things that the founders used their own power to establish. They helped create a world that increasingly had, alas, little place for political leaders like them. Benefits have of course flowed from the rise of egalitarian anti-elitist democracy, but -- if Wood is right -- much was lost as well. Miller helps us understand the full nature of such a loss. (H. L. Mencken, by the way, years ago put Wood's point in a less scholarly but more memorable way: "As democracy is perfected, the office of president represents, more and more, the inner soul of the people. On some great and glorious day the plain folks of the land will reach their heart's desire and the White House will be adorned by a downright moron.")

Once we stop simply dismissing revenge or getting even as intrinsically irrational or evil, and come to see at least some evaluative coherence in talionic justice, we might be able to come to an understanding of certain features of contemporary criminal punishment that previously seemed inexplicable. Let me then close this review by exploring a question not explicitly discussed by Miller but which came to my mind as a result of reading Miller's book -- the kind of stimulation that, as I earlier suggested, could be of benefit to a philosopher. The question is this: Why does actual harm caused play such a large role in determining the severity of punishment that a criminal receives?

The role of harm may pose an interesting challenge to those who think that civilized criminal law has moved beyond vengeance. Consider this: We punish attempted murder that fails through a fortuity (the gun jams, for example) far less severely than actual murder. Why is this? Why should they not be treated with equal severity? Is our attempted murderer less evil (less malicious in heart) than the successful killer? Surely not, since one does not become a better person simply in virtue of having a faulty gun. Is he less dangerous, less likely to pose a future threat? Probably not since he has now learned to use a better weapon. So why then do we punish him less? The best explanation may simply be that, since no harm occurred, there is no payback due -- nothing to get even for. So unless one wants a radical redesign of the criminal law so that actual harm caused plays no important role, one might want to be a bit cautious before confidently asserting that payback or getting even has no legitimate role to play here. If we had a very different and sophisticated concept of harm -- viewing harm simply as having our right not to be put at unjustified risk violated -- we could then perhaps justify treating our attempted murderer the same as our murderer, since both acted to impose the same unjustified risk. This is not our actual concept of harm, however, and I do not think that it is likely to be so in the future. I never will hate the negligent driver who (out of pure good luck) just misses killing my child nearly as much as I will hate and want to hurt the equally negligent driver who (out of pure bad luck) does kill my child. I do not think I am at all atypical in this regard, and I know that I (and many others) would want the state, through its criminal law, to ignore all pious sermons against vindictiveness and revenge and to treat the child killer much more harshly than the one who misses the child. Wanting to hurt the person who wrongfully killed my child probably should not always be my last word, but it surely has every right to be my first word. Those to whom this seems correct will thus be forced to admit that Miller has been correct in seeing some virtues for revenge even in our contemporary world. (A query: Can honor explain the desire for revenge in cases such as the death of one's child at the hands of a wrongdoer? Might not love or wounds to love sometimes provoke the desire for revenge?)

Miller does not strike me as a victim of nostalgic fantasies about the past (he always notes problems in the cultures and practices in which he also sees merit) nor does he strike me as someone who would like totally to abandon all aspects of the modern world and make a return to the past. He is fascinated by revenge and ancient revenge cultures, not because he wants us to live in one, but because he sees that they did contain some real virtues -- a kind of nobility -- that it might benefit us to recognize and recapture to some substantial degree. At the very least, he has warned us not to shrink in horror when we find remnants of these cultures in our present practices and assume that these remnants could contain nothing but evil and must immediately be discarded. In this regard, I will let the final paragraph of his book be the last word here:

Though we have progressed in some domains … it is not obvious to me that we are better psychologists and social scientists than humans were in centuries past. Indeed it is obvious to me that we are not. Nor are we better educators and scholars. And with no irony I can attest to my belief that when it comes to understanding human motivation -- no less than to understanding justice and what it means to get even -- we are not as smart now as we were when people worried more about their honor than about their pleasure. (p. 202)

1 See, for example, Peter French, The Virtues of Vengeance, University Press of Kansas, 2001, and some of my own work: "Getting Even -- The Role of the Victim," Social Philosophy and Policy, Volume 7, Number 2 , 1990; "Two Cheers for Vindictiveness," Punishment and Society, Volume 2, Number 2, 2000 -- an essay that modifies and softens the position developed in the earlier essay concerning the role that vindictiveness might play in contemporary American criminal sentencing and which appears, with even more modifications, as Chapter Two of my book Getting Even -- Forgiveness and its Limits, Oxford University Press, 2003.