Facets of Sociality

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Nikos Psarros and Katainka Schulte-Ostermann (eds.), Facets of Sociality, Ontos, 2006, 370pp., $98.00 (hbk), ISBN 3938793392.

Reviewed by Frank Hindriks, University of Groningen, the Netherlands


At the heart of the field of social ontology lies the idea that people can share intentional states. Two people can go for a walk together and several hundreds of people can perform Mahler's Symphony of a Thousand. And when they do so they share an intention. Contributors to the debate are divided as to what it means to share an intention, but they have in common the idea that doing so must involve more than just a collection of individuals having a particular individual intention mutually believing of each other that this is the case. They might, for instance, have an intention to perform a joint action partly because they believe others do so, and they might have plans for coordinating the interaction between participants during the course of its performance, as Michael Bratman has it. Or they might be jointly committed to an intention to perform the joint action as a body, to use Margaret Gilbert's way of explicating the phenomenon. Theories of such collective intentionality form the common thread through the essays in Facets of Sociality.

The volume covers all three of the major areas in social ontology, to wit the (possibly) social preconditions of intentionality, collective intentionality and joint action, and the ontology of institutions. It also includes three essays on social epistemology. The volume is based on the conference Holistic Epistemology and Theory of Action held in Leipzig in 2004. It contains several interesting contributions for specialists in the field. Some papers are comments on other papers. Unfortunately, some of the self-standing papers do not refer to other papers in the volume at all, even though they could have benefited substantially from doing so. The quality of the papers is mixed. The most significant contributions, which are the ones on which I focus below, pertain to joint action and cultural and institutional objects. Several papers concerning the social preconditions of intentionality are hard to follow, because they do not clearly distinguish the topic from collective intentionality and joint action. Even if one were to be convinced that they are not really distinct -- a claim that seems hard to sustain -- this should be spelled out clearly and argued for separately.

Both Margaret Gilbert and Raimo Tuomela stress the continuity between their accounts of joint and individual action. This has as an advantage that they thereby make their commitments more explicit. Gilbert addresses some doubts about her notion of a joint commitment. It turns out that she regards it as the analogue of personal commitment involved in individual intentions. She claims that if someone fails to act as she decided, she is answerable (only) to herself, and may experience a sense of self-betrayal. An individual (non-morally) owes it to herself to conform to her intention. Gilbert regards personal decisions as commitments of the will that provide sufficient reason for action. Now, if one believes that individual intentions are normative in this sense, it is rather natural to suppose that joint intentions are also normative in a similar way. According to Gilbert, joint intentions come with obligations including an obligation not to rescind unless others consent to one's rescinding. Conversely, however, those who do not believe individual intentions provide reasons for action will also be doubtful of the idea that joint intentions come with obligations, which Gilbert presumably regards as reason-giving as well.

Tuomela models his account of joint action on that of individual action. The idea that they have in common is that to act intentionally is to act from a relevant intention. Tuomela goes as far as saying that the main argument for his analysis is that it is similar to that of individual action (178). He describes 'the joint action case' as one in which the agents act jointly 'as a group or as one agent' (ibid. and 189). Unfortunately, he does not explain why this is to be taken metaphorically (171).

Another parallel between individual and joint action that Tuomela points out is that they can be performed on the basis of an intention-in-action rather than on a prior joint intention (186, 190). Such actions are spontaneous and involve "we-willings". One would like to know more, however. Given that joint actions require coordination and depend on the (interrelations between) intentions of the participants, it appears that the formation of a joint intention must involve communication, and, hence, precedes the performance of the action. Tuomela adds to this difficulty by requiring even in such spontaneous cases that 'the agents intentionally participated because of a group reason' (190). One wonders how this can be if no prior process of public deliberation is involved (and the group does not involve authority relations that could be taken to entail that one person can determine the reason for acting of all). Perhaps this objection is not to the point, as he later claims that a social reason is only 'a shared intended collective goal to act together'. But this appears to trivialize the claim that a social reason is required. Perhaps it should just be taken as another way of saying that (we-mode) joint action involves a collective commitment. The problem appears to be even worse for Gilbert. She also claims that joint intentions can be joint-intentions-in-action, but her account of joint intention is dynamic in that it focuses on how a joint intention is formed. She appeals to the notion of expressing one's willingness. Perhaps what she has in mind is that one can try to initiate a joint action on the spot without there having been a prior expression of willingness, and that one succeeds in initiating a joint action if others join in spontaneously, their contributions being an expression of willingness. Again, one would like to know more.

Frank Kannetsky criticizes Tuomela's account for its circularity. Tuomela admits that his account is weakly circular in that some notion of joint action is presupposed in his analysis of joint action because the participating agents conceive of the action as a joint action and of their contributions as parts of that action. In fact, this feature of his analysis -- which goes back at least to his well-known joint paper with Kaarlo Miller from 1988 -- is often overlooked by critics who, as a consequence, take his position to be more reductive or individualist than it is. However, he provides several arguments as to why the circularity is unproblematic. Among the ones he presents in his paper in this volume are the claim that joint action has a genetic basis, which makes it plausible that 'at least rudimentary we-mode thinking and acting is genetically based' as well, and the claim that individual action is also taken to be a conceptually primitive notion (177). Kannetsky does not engage with either of these arguments nor with others that Tuomela has presented here and elsewhere. Boris Hennig provides an adequate discussion of this shortcoming of the paper as well as of the flaws of Kannetsky's alternative. Another reason why Kannetsky's contribution is disappointing is that he obviously misinterprets Gilbert. He takes her to hold that a social group in her plural subject sense is constituted by agreement, while Gilbert has gone to great length to emphasize this is not the case. Rather, agreement can be explicated in terms of joint commitment. This is especially clear from Gilbert's work on political obligation including her recent book A Theory of Political Obligation (OUP, 2006). Her account differs from its main rival, the Lockean theory, in that she appeals to joint commitment rather than to (tacit) agreement.

Hans Bernhard Schmid observes that almost all contributors to the literature on collective intentionality focus on (what they take to be) paradigmatic cases, Annette Baier being one of the few exceptions. He argues that many cases of joint action involve individuals who do not want to participate, do not do so, or stop doing so. The provocative claim that he subsequently puts forward is that the relation 'between the participating individuals' intentionality and the collective intention' is normative rather than constitutive (294). By this he means that those involved in the relevant action ought to have the relevant participatory intentions. This, however, raises the question how one can identify participants in a joint action if not by their intentional attitudes. As it turns out, Schmid is primarily concerned with social practices rather than joint actions per se (he uses the term 'shared intentional activity'). This provides a way of identifying members of a group who do not participate in a particular practice. There might be several social practices in which more or less the same group of people participates. Perhaps they even (partly) derive their identity from it. Now it is clear that many social practices involve normative expectations, and some of them may pertain to participation in the practice itself (on doing one's part, as Schmid puts it). It is not obvious, however, that they are constitutive of practices. And Schmid's own observation that expectations concerning the actions of others turn into normative expectations gradually suggests they are not (296). Of course, one could argue that, for instance, institutions involve such normative expectations by definition whereas mere social practices do not. It will be clear, however, that this is a matter of (perfectly legitimate) conceptual regimentation. If developed in this direction, the claim loses its provocative character (and its novelty).

Another way of interpreting the claim is as pertaining to social groups existing over time. Schmid has this in mind when he discusses Tuomela's notion of non-operative membership at the end of the paper. Non-operative members are members who do not contribute actively to a particular joint action, possibly because they have no part to play in the first place. Schmid argues that 'one main step in loosening the conceptual constraints on group membership and acting as a group member should be to switch from "is" to "ought" in the analysis of the relation between collective intentions and the intentionality of the participating individuals' (302). Now I agree that there are cases for which introducing obligations or at least normative expectations regarding participation is useful. However, there also appear to be cases for which it is not, including cases in which participation is explicitly not required (perhaps even counterproductive). Again, it appears that normative relations are not constitutive of collective intentions.

The paper also includes a promising account of dissent. Schmid takes dissidents to be group members who differ from other members regarding what '"our" collective plans, projects, and actions should be' (297), and suggests that dissidents see themselves as 'forced not to do their part in our communal practices in order to do justice to their views of what the collective should be' (298).

In his contribution to the volume, Barry Smith continues his exchange with John Searle concerning the shortcomings of Searle's account of the ontology of institutions. Searle has argued that all it takes to account for the ontology of institutional reality, and social reality for that matter, are the notions of collective intentionality, the assignment of function, and constitutive rule. All of these so-called building blocks of social reality play a role in Searle's account of institutional entities. Consider Searle's favorite example: money. It involves a (status) function, presumably that of a means of exchange. Objects have this status function because we collectively accept that they do so. And constitutive rules explicate the entities to which the function is assigned. The structure of constitutive rules is "X counts as Y in circumstances C". The entities to which status functions are assigned are physical entities of some sort, at least ultimately. Smith's main criticism of Searle's institutional ontology is that there are some institutional functions for which no physical entity can be identified on which it is imposed. The most convincing example, which provided the focus of earlier discussions, is that of electronic money. Surely the electronic signals represent money rather than constituting it.

One of the distinctive features of Searle's institutional ontology is that it covers not only institutional actions but also institutional entities of a variety of other kinds including objects and roles. To promise and to marry are institutional actions; money and property are institutional objects; policemen and the president of Finland are persons with institutional roles. The X-term, then, has different kinds of referents depending on the kind of institutional entity at issue. Smith is aware of the fact that the X term in a constitutive rule can refer to all kinds of things, including human beings (7). He fails to see, however, that this resolves his worry of there not being anything physical on which a certain institutional function is imposed, at least in many cases. Smith mentions debts, rights, obligations and bond derivatives. They can, however, plausibly be seen as institutional properties of persons (or agents more generally including, for instance, businesses). Smith claims that debts have a temporal structure and 'a deontic element' (7). He also points out that they depend on representations for their existence (8). Now it appears natural to say that a person's having a debt is a matter of that person having an obligation to pay a certain amount of money in the future and that the conditions of this obligation are documented in one way or another. The only reason for insisting that there is no X term here, at least that I can think of, is that Smith takes debts to be objects (that can in principle also exist without a physical document on which its conditions are specified). Of course, human beings are not debts. However, they do have debts. And someone's having a debt is a matter of that person having an institutional property, that of having a certain kind of obligation. Apart from this, there just is nothing to account for.

These remarks certainly do not answer all Smith's worries. Consider for example Mahler's Symphony of a Thousand mentioned earlier. Of course, there are many representations of this entity, but it is not constituted by any of them (nor by all). Perhaps for such cases Smith's notion of a quasi-abstract object is useful. Such objects have no physical parts but they do have a history. The Symphony of a Thousand appears to have these properties: the symphony does not have any physical parts; at the same time, it has temporal properties such as having been completed in 1906. It is a pity that Smith nowhere comments on Arto Siitonen's paper on Carnap on the constitution of cultural objects. Siitonen argues that Carnap regards cultural objects as autonomous (42), but at the same time 'reducible to their manifestations and documentations' (40). Documentations are physical entities, and the manifestations of cultural objects are mental phenomena. Their autonomy resides in the fact that cultural objects cannot be identified with any particular manifestation or documentation. Presumably Smith would accept this last claim. Perhaps the point of difference is that he would reject the reducibility claim. It would be interesting to find out more about what exactly Smith has in mind. Thus far, one can easily come to believe that calling a symphony a quasi-abstract object is merely a matter of giving a name to the problem that is left unresolved.