Facing Death: Epicurus and his Critics

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James Warren, Facing Death: Epicurus and his Critics, Oxford University Press, 2004, 256pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199252890.

Reviewed by Lawrence Jost, University of Cincinnati


This book is what Epicureans and their critics, both hostile and sympathetic, have been waiting for. It is rare, indeed, to find a work that shows both a solid grasp of ancient texts, their proper philological interpretation and appreciation, and is at the same time clearly cognizant of the contemporary philosophical debates on the issues originally raised by our Greek sources. This is such a book and its publication will prove to be a milestone. Serious[1] metaphysicians today are most likely to be physicalists and, even if we are not all physicalists now, the ancient atomists from Democritus through Lucretius, and especially Epicurus, were the closest in spirit to our modern metaphysics. How many, however, take on the Epicurean challenge in light of their physicalist convictions? That is, how many address forthrightly the old claim that "Death is nothing to us; for what is dispersed does not perceive, and what does not perceive is nothing to us" (Warren's translation of the famous second of the "Principal Doctrines", hereafter abbreviated following the usual convention as K[uriai] D[oxai] 2). Ted Honderich speaks for many a skeptic when he replies: "Epicurus tells us not to worry about death, because it itself isn't experienced -- where you are, your death isn't, and where it is you aren't. Only impressionable logicians are consoled" (quoted on p. 110, fn. 3). It is hard to say how many are now, or ever were, consoled by the doctrine or even how impressionable you have to be to follow the basic logic, but Warren has done a signal service in disambiguating several key claims made in the Epicurean tradition.

There are, he thinks, four main fears about death and its discontents that need to be addressed: (1) fear of being dead, (2) fear (or distress) that one will die and disappear, (3) fear of dying prematurely, and (4) fear of the process of dying. In chapters 1-4 he addresses each concern, exploring both the ancient and modern controversies about the (un)reasonableness of each fear, and then addresses in chapter 5 the positive case to be made for leading an Epicurean life, concluding with a chapter that summarizes the argument of the whole and ends on an upbeat note: "Although it is never too late to begin, Epicurean philosophy is not a 'quick fix'. Axiochus [an eponymous character in a pseudo-Platonic dialogue who has heard fashionable, even eloquent arguments of the sort Epicureans offer but remains unconvinced nevertheless] should have studied longer and harder before now. Had he done so, perhaps these arguments would have got through to his soul, lodged there, and been integrated fully into his other beliefs, transforming his view of a good life and his view of death" (221). "Better late than never" goes the common saying; if Warren is right in this book, it's not too late to finally appreciate this seemingly bleak worldview. If not, it is going to take some good counter-argument to the contrary. And argument or, rather arguments, is what it's all about. The Hellenistic philosophers offered numerous arguments both for their own schools' positions and against those of others and Warren surveys many of their original versions as well as later reformulations. He is aware, as Aristotle was, that arguments alone will not make people decent (NE X.1179b5 ff.) or (in this case) calm their fears but, insofar as they do have a role to play in "cognitive therapy," Epicurean arguments will have some considerable force and should not be entirely dismissed (p. 219). Let's look at a few, both ancient and modern and how they are treated in this book.

Take the argument against (4) first, that about fearing the process of dying. Here, once we distinguish between the pain involved in dying, say, from a slowly spreading incurable lung cancer, and the death itself which results, we can see that it is the pain involved in the process that is fearful. That is why it is perfectly reasonable to seek good palliative care in cases such as this, from humane physicians who freely dispense morphine or, perhaps, in a hospice setting. The fear of death itself must "always be kept distinct from the fear of pain" and we are assured that "Epicurus, of course, as a good hedonist would wholeheartedly endorse any mechanism which allows us to avoid pain" (p. 10); and so say almost all of us, except maybe for those who think the pain of suffering and dying is good for our souls. But, here the fundamental argument of KD 2 against (1) the fear of being dead, of a post mortem state of non-existence, comes into play because while "qua painful event" dying is of understandable concern, "qua loss of life, it is not at all to be feared" (p. 12), since when our lives are over we're no longer around to experience anything painful or pleasant. The full Epicurean argument against (1), then, is as follows (p. 23):

1. Death is the dissolution of the soul.

2. What is dissolved does not perceive.

3. therefore (by 1 & 2) Death is the absence of perception.

4. What is not perceived is nothing to us.

and (by 3 & 4) 5. Death is nothing to us. QED

One could deny the first premise, but that's not available to those who don't take immortality of the soul seriously; so, recent attention has been focused on the fourth -- maybe we can be harmed by unperceived evils and death might well be (a big) one of those. Tom Nagel takes this tack when he argues that death in many cases deprives us of great goods we might have had if we didn't die, and insofar as it does this, death is to be feared because it is reasonable to fear the loss of the good things we might well have had, e.g., seeing the fruits of our labors, our children and their children prospering, that life of productive retirement in a nice town with a good college nearby, and so on. Death, it is claimed, deprives us of many goods that might well have come our way if we had gone on living and that's why it is bad to die. This intuitive appeal is strengthened by the counterfactual considerations advanced by Fred Feldman and others: "death is a harm in so far as it robs the deceased of goods he would have experienced had he died later" (p. 31).

Warren worries that such arguments can easily prove too much, e.g. that all deaths are harms since in all but the most desperate cases we can easily imagine goods one would be deprived of by death or, worse yet, that a comparative approach to evaluating lives counterfactually will easily make all of us deprived of many things and thus harmed by being deprived of same. Am I harmed by not being in the Hall of Fame for that pitching career with the Yankees I never had? By not teaching at Harvard? Not being famous? And so on (p. 33). At least here there is still a subject, viz. me, who might be said to miss these things (not really); when you're dead, however, you don't exist (by naturalistic hypothesis), and it seems reasonable for the Epicurean to say that for something X to be a genuine harm, something bad for a person, injurious to her or him, that person must exist at the time of X (p. 41). This nicely allows the Epicurean to admit that some unperceived harms might be harms although unperceived at the time while claiming that "the person and the supposed harm must coincide temporally" (p. 42). So, it is no harm to me now that were I to live longer than I end up doing I might have enjoyed more good stuff. Real deprivation has to have a subject, someone who in fact suffers harm, whether perceived or unperceived. This allows us, for example, to agree with Martha Nussbaum and others that even if a Mormon wife (of 4 or 5) in rural Utah does not think she is harmed by her lifestyle, she might still be deprived of a number of goods she would have appreciated if (counterfactually) she were sufficiently exposed to them. But she is not dead, and when she is the Epicurean insists she's beyond harm then, if not now. Of course she may well be perfectly happy and content and not feel deprived now. The point is that counterfactual harm is not real harm unless you are around to be its subject.

A celebrated argument in Lucretius, the Symmetry Argument, might help one to see this. No one claims to have been deprived of all the good things they might have experienced if they had been born earlier than they were, that they have in any way been harmed by not having been in Athens in the "glory days". But, it is said, the long duration of past non-existence is comparable to the period to come of one's future non-existence: "Look back similarly at how the stretch of unending time before we are born has been nothing to us. Nature, therefore, offers this reflection (speculum) to us of the time to come after our eventual death" (Warren's translation [p.58] of lines 972-5 of De Rerum Natura). He goes on to distinguish two versions of the argument, one that picks out the relevant first premise as Pi: Our pre-natal non-existence was nothing to us before we were born. This is to be distinguished from Pii: Looking back from within a lifetime, our pre-natal non-existence is nothing to us. Both versions use the same middle premise SYM: Prenatal existence is relevantly like post mortem non-existence. Their conclusions are different, however. In the first version we conclude that our post mortem non-existence will be nothing to us after our death, while the second says that looking forward from within this life, that our post mortem non-existence is nothing to us now. Some fancy philological work involving verb tenses on pp. 64-8, along with a reluctance to endorse the conclusion of the second version, leads Warren to argue that Lucretius' argument is best formulated with Pi and not Pii, in which case it adds nothing significant to Epicurus' original. That is, more work is needed to show that our future non-existence means nothing to us now in light of the fact that our past non-existence meant nothing at the time since, again, we weren't there to miss anything. This leads Warren to an extensive examination of metaphysical musings offered up by Nagel, Derek Parfit, and Joseph Raz, all in search of an interesting version of the symmetry argument, one that might do real work in advancing Epicurean objectives. It is impossible to summarize his discussion here but some of his counter-arguments may well fail to meet their targets, given the subtlety of these particular critics. On Warren's reading of Epicurus, however, he thinks that they have all missed an important principle in the Letter to Menoeceus 125, viz. that "whatever causes no pain when present, causes only empty distress when anticipated". Whether this principle will yield the desired conclusion is doubtful, I think, unless one is already an Epicurean committed to the basic doctrine and trying to be consistent.

What about, then, fearing a premature death, before one's time, before life-projects are completed? Here we might well think that it is reasonable to fear failure and Warren carefully considers questions about when we might say that someone's life is complete, whether it isn't arbitrary to suggest any age -- 70, 80 …? He finds that the Epicureans, like Aristotle, can have a robust notion of a complete and hence eudaimon life while denying that they need to have any definite conception of what particular shape such a life should have apart from reaching the ideal goal of ataraxia or 'unperturbedness', which goal could be reached relatively early in one's maturity. This goal itself, however, presents challenges. If we die before achieving ataraxia we can truly be said to die prematurely and so the "near-ataraxic budding Epicurean" might be "correct in thinking that were he to die before attaining ataraxia he would die prematurely" and this might lead him to fear this fate (p. 157). What's an Epicurean to do? If the person is disturbed by the thought he will die too soon, it only looks like special pleading to claim that he should relinquish this fear and "get with the program". If he has not yet completed his journey, he seems to have reason to be concerned about dying before he has completed it.

In chapter 5 Warren discusses objections to the whole Epicurean project of seeking the sort of eudaimonia envisaged as ataraxia, concentrating on objections from Cicero on made by the ancients from various non-hedonistic positions. In particular, if life is likely to be miserable, to contain much more pain than pleasure, why not end it? The philosophical problem of rational suicide is raised and, in contrast with the Stoics, Epicureans seem to take a generally negative attitude toward the practice (p. 205). Warren concludes this chapter by admitting that the "Epicureans appear to offer no significant positive reason for wishing to continue to live, beyond a mere inertia", with "precious few resources to explain why continued life is worth pursuing" (p. 210). He admits that this is not a very appealing picture of the truly happy life but feels they pushed themselves into this by so resolutely denying that death might be an evil. In their zeal to get us not to be fearful of death they may have left themselves unwilling to countenance "desires held with sufficient strength that they are accompanied by an anxiety about their fulfillment" (p. 212). Stoics, Peripatetics, and others might well find this Epicurean predicament of their own making. It would be churlish, however, not to welcome this vigorous re-statement and re-examination of their original arguments, both negative and positive, even if we are not convinced that living an Epicurean life is necessarily the best life. Perhaps we can be inspired to meet our end with some of the equanimity that the master exhibited at the end of his life when we are told that he was calm in coping with his kidney ailment, living for 14 days with the pain of being unable to urinate, recollecting his past and very pleasant philosophical conversations.

[1] Frank Jackson characterizes serious metaphysics as the kind that takes its start from claims such as that "solidity is not an additional feature of reality over and above the way lattice-like arrays of molecules tend to repel each other … . By serious metaphysics, I mean metaphysics inspired by [this kind of example], metaphysics that acknowledges that we can do better than draw up big lists, that seeks comprehension in terms of a more or less limited number of ingredients, or anyway a smaller list than we started with … [It] is discriminatory at the same time as claiming to be complete, or complete with respect to some subject-matter … serious metaphysics means that there are inevitably a host of putative features of our world which we must either eliminate or locate." (From Metaphsics to Ethics: A Defence of Conceptual Metaphysics (Oxford University Press, 1998), p. 5 et passim). Eliminating the fear of death is surely the main Epicurean idea about death and locating in a naturalistic framework whatever is sensible in other fears associated with death its main contribution today. Warren's book as a whole well illustrates an ancient anticipation of what a serious metaphysics of death might look like today, one not met with readily in today's philosophy.