Facing Facts

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Neale, Stephen, Facing Facts, Oxford University Press, 2001, 254pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199247153.

Reviewed by John MacFarlane, University of California, Berkeley


Most people’s first reaction on seeing a “slingshot argument,” like the one in the opening pages of Davidson’s “Truth and Meaning,” is to doubt that what looks like a formal trick could really have philosophical significance. In this book, Stephen Neale establishes conclusively that the slingshot does have a philosophical upshot—though not the radical upshot Quine and Davidson took it to have. It does not preclude theories of facts, but it constrains them, and thanks to Neale we have a precise characterization of how it constrains them. It is too easy to say that it is the best book ever written on the subject, since to my knowledge it is the only such book. But Neale’s book is written with such thoroughness, clarity, and rigor that no other may ever be needed.

The slingshot is not a single argument, but a family of arguments designed to show that intensional entities (facts, states of affairs, propositions) must be individuated either so finely or so crudely that they can do no useful work. One way to think about the individuation of facts is to ask what substitutions for p and q make the following schema true:

(S) The fact that p = the fact that q,

or, employing a convenient notation,

(S) [p] = [q].

Clearly (S) will be true when p and q are the same, but unless facts are to be mere reflections of true sentences, there ought to be true instances of (S) where p and q are distinct. Plausibly,

(1) [Cicero wrote De Finibus] = [Tully wrote De Finibus],


(2) [Neale wrote Descriptions] = [Descriptions was written by Neale].

Moreover, since Neale is the author of Facing Facts, it is natural to think that

(3) [Neale wrote Descriptions] = [the author of Facing Facts wrote Descriptions].

It is also natural to suppose that two sentences that are logically or necessarily equivalent must represent the same fact. So,

(4) [No humans have gills] = [nothing with gills is a human].

But these seemingly innocuous concessions are already enough to trivialize our theory of facts. Let S and T be any true sentences. Then

(5) [S] = [Socrates = the x such that (x = Socrates and S)],

since “S” and “Socrates is the x such that x = Socrates and S” are logically equivalent.


(6) [T] = [Socrates = the x such that (x = Socrates and T)].


(7) The x such that (x = Socrates and S) = the x such that (x = Socrates and T),

since both descriptions denote Socrates. So, substituting co-denoting descriptions into (5), we get

(8) [S] = [Socrates = the x such that (x = Socrates and T)].

Finally, by (6), (8), and the transitivity of fact-identity, we get

(9) [S] = [T].

Since S and T were arbitrary true sentences, the upshot is that there is only one fact. And the argument can easily be recast as an argument against propositions, states of affairs, or intensional connectives.

If this form of argument is sound, the consequences are huge. We must do semantics without propositions. We must abjure all non-extensional connectives, including modal, temporal, and causal operators. If there are no facts, then (as Davidson argues) we cannot make sense of the correspondence theory of truth, nor of “conceptual schemes,” nor indeed of representation. (What is there for sentences to represent, if not facts or states of affairs?) And if we cannot make sense of representation, Rorty has urged, many of the traditional problems of philosophy simply dissolve.

Sound or unsound, the slingshot has had an enormous impact on twentieth-century philosophy. But is it sound? The sample slingshot above relies on two assumptions:

(A1) When p results from q by substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions, then the fact that p = the fact that q.
(A2) When p and q are logically equivalent, then the fact that p = the fact that q.

The problem is that although the use of each of these assumptions is plausible on some understanding of the definite descriptions involved, it is not clear that any single way of taking the descriptions justifies using both assumptions.

If we adopt a Russellian semantics for the descriptions, then (as Gödel saw already in 1944) (A1) is problematic. On Russell’s account, definite descriptions are quantifiers, not singular terms. The sentence

(10) The author of Facing Facts wrote Descriptions

says that there is a unique author of Facing Facts, and that he or she wrote Descriptions. On this reading, (10) does not mention Stephen Neale, just as

(11) The author of Descriptions wrote Descriptions

does not mention Facing Facts. Indeed, (11), but not (10), is compatible with the possibility that Facing Facts and Descriptions were written by different people. So why should we suppose that the fact that (10) = the fact that (11)?

On the other hand, if we adopt a referential semantics for definite descriptions, then it is plausible to suppose that (10) and (11) do represent the same fact, the fact that Stephen Neale, the man himself, wrote Descriptions. But now the use of (A2) seems fishy. It is not clear that S and

(12) Socrates = the x such that (x = Socrates and S)

should count as logically equivalent when the description is construed referentially. (Whether they do depends on the details of the referential semantics and the precise definition of logical equivalence.) Even if S and (12) do turn out to be logically equivalent, there is no reason to suppose that S and (12) represent the same fact. After all, (12) is at least partly about Socrates, while S need not be. As Barwise and Perry pointed out in 1981, substitution of logical equivalents need not preserve subject matter, and surely two sentences with different subject matters do not represent the same fact.

These problems with the slingshot have been well known for two decades. What need is there, then, for a whole book on slingshot arguments? Neale thinks that neither the proponents nor the critics of slingshot arguments have yet succeeded in saying exactly what these arguments show. As a result, the proponents have overestimated the force of the slingshot, while the critics have underestimated it. The primary task of Neale’s book is to formulate a valid slingshot argument that yields the most generally applicable conclusion with the weakest possible premises.

To secure maximal generality, Neale formulates his slingshot in an abstract “connective” form. That is, instead of appealing to assumptions about when two sentences correspond to the same fact (or express the same proposition, or describe the same state of affairs), he uses assumptions about which substitutions within the scope of a schematic sentential connective @ are truth-preserving. For example, the connective version of Church’s slingshot shows that if substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions and of logically equivalent sentences within the scope of @ is truth-preserving, then so is the substitution of any true sentence for any other. If we now interpret @ as “the fact that … is identical with the fact that Neale wrote Descriptions,” the argument shows that in order to avoid the collapse of all facts into one “Great Fact,” a theorist of facts must reject either substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions or substitution of logically equivalent sentences (or both) within the scope of “the fact that….” But we can get other conclusions as well, by interpreting @ as “the proposition that … is identical with the proposition that Neale wrote Descriptions,” or “it is morally required that ….” That is the beauty of recasting the argument abstractly: we avoid contaminating it with assumptions particular to this or that theory.

To weaken the premises required by the slingshot, Neale starts with Gödel’s version of the slingshot rather than Church’s. Where Church’s version of the slingshot requires substitution of logical equivalents inside the scope of @, Gödel’s uses the principle that “Fa” can be substituted for “a = the x such that (x=a and Fx)” (and vice versa) inside the scope of @. One important difference is that unlike substitution of logical equivalents, “Gödelian substitution” seems to preserve subject matter: at any rate, no new non-logical vocabulary is introduced.

The conclusion of Neale’s connective version of Gödel’s slingshot is that any connective allowing both substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions and Gödelian substitution within its scope will also allow substitution of any atomic sentence for another with the same truth value. The abstractness of this conclusion allows Neale to go beyond the usual debates about the soundness of the slingshot, which inevitably rely on particular assumptions about facts and semantics, and instead see the slingshot as imposing a precise constraint on theories of facts, propositions, and other intensional entities. The slingshot shows that theorists of facts must take a definite stand on the semantics of definite descriptions, one that shows why contexts within the scope of “the fact that” are opaque to substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions or Gödelian substitution (or both), but transparent to substitution of co-referring singular terms. (Without at least this much transparency, Neale assumes, facts would be too closely tied to our means of representing them to do useful philosophical work.) The upshot, then, is that “choices made about the semantics of descriptions and the metaphysics of facts place non-trivial constraints upon one another” (13).

Neale suggests that the slingshot offers indirect support for the Russellian treatment of definite descriptions he defended in Descriptions, which explains neatly how intensional contexts can be transparent to substitution of co-referring singular terms without being transparent to substitution of co-denoting definite descriptions. This indirect support would be more impressive if the failure of the problematic inference principles could not be explained by any non-Russellian treatments of definite descriptions. However, as Neale shows in a useful survey of such treatments, only some of them license the inference principles used in Gödel’s slingshot.

In fact, Neale has to stretch to find anyone defending a theory of facts that is straightforwardly ruled out by Gödel’s slingshot. The best candidates he has to offer are Austin, N. L. Wilson, and the early Wittgenstein, and in order to apply the slingshot to their theories, he has to do quite a bit of speculative reconstruction. Thus Neale overstates his case when he suggests that the slingshot rules out “many theories” of facts (44), leaving theorists of facts only a “narrow gully” in which they can find “limited cover” (65 n. 41). Rather, as Neale’s own discussion shows, theorists of facts can choose from a range of theories of descriptions that would allow them to evade the slingshot. The real burden falls on philosophers like Quine and Davidson, who think that the slingshot rules out theories of facts: it is they who need to argue for one of the comparatively few theories of definite descriptions that would validate the substitution principles used in the slingshot.

Readers of Neale’s 1995 paper “The Philosophical Significance of Gödel’s Slingshot” may wonder what is new in the book (besides various improvements and amplifications to the core argument). The most prominent additions are as follows:

* A masterful exposition of Davidson's program in semantics,
* A useful discussion of Davidson's criticisms of the correspondence theory of truth, conceptual relativism, and the scheme/content distinction, emphasizing the extent to which these criticisms depend on his use of the slingshot,
* A critical analysis of the use Rorty makes of Davidson in his criticisms of realism and representation,
* A short chapter on the Fregean roots of the slingshot,
* A more leisurely discussion of Russell's views on facts and descriptions,
* A new chapter on scope and extensionality,
* A useful appendix on "incomplete symbols" in Russell, which distinguishes the oft-conflated ideas of (i) requiring a contextual definition, (ii) being incomplete, and (iii) disappearing on analysis.

There is much of interest here, but because space is limited, I will restrict myself to a few comments on Neale’s discussion of extensionality. This discussion is important because the substitution principles used in the slingshot license only substitutions in extensional sentences that occur as operands of @. They do not license substitutions within the scope of another non-extensional operator that is itself within the scope of @. In order to state these principles rigorously, then, we need to distinguish extensional sentences from non-extensional ones. The problem is that Neale’s definitions don’t settle whether quantified sentences, like “(x)Fx”, are extensional. This is not an innocent omission, for the language in which Neale frames his slingshot argument is quantificational.

A sentence is extensional, says Neale, just in case “its extension is determined by its syntax and the extensions of its parts” (147). So “(x)Fx” is extensional just in case its extension is a function of the extensions of “(x)” and “Fx”. Yet Neale never defines the extension of a quantifier like “(x)” or an open formula like “Fx”. Instead of giving a general definition of “extension,” he simply stipulates what is to count as the extensions of the various types of expression occurring in “a simple formal language L that contains just names (individual constants), predicates, and truth-functional connectives” (138). The extension of a sentence in such a language is its truth value. But what is the extension of an open formula in a quantificational language? Neale does not say.

There are two ways he might go here. (i) He might take the extension of an open formula to be a truth value, adding that expressions have extensions only relative to a satisfaction sequence, or (ii) he might take the extension of an open formula to be a function from satisfaction sequences to truth values. The first option will not serve Neale’s purposes. If the extension of “Fx” (relative to a satisfaction sequence s) is just a truth value, then “(x)Fx” doesn’t count as an extensional sentence. For the truth value of “(x)Fx” (relative to s) is not a function of the truth value of “Fx” (relative to s). Indeed, on this understanding of extensionality, no quantificational sentence counts as extensional. This would spell disaster for Neale’s version of the slingshot, which treats “a = the x such that (x=a and Fx)” as an extensional sentence, even though on the Russellian reading Neale favors, this sentence is quantificational in form.

Better, then, to take the second option and say that the extension of “Fx” is a function from satisfaction sequences to truth values. This would allow quantifiers to be extensional operators and quantified sentences to be extensional sentences. But it would also falsify Neale’s claim that “the class of extensional connectives is the same thing as the class of truth-functional connectives” (147). The connective * such that

for any formula F and sequence s, *F is true on s iff F is true on every sequence,

would be extensional (in this second sense) but not truth-functional. (As I use the term, a one-place connective @ is truth-functional just in case for any formula F, open or closed, the truth value of @F on a sequence s depends only on the truth value of F on s. Neale might protest that * is “truth-functional” in a weaker sense: for any sentence S, the truth value of *S depends only on the truth value of S. But it is possible to devise connectives that are truth-functional in this weaker sense, yet not extensional. So Neale’s claim that all and only extensional connectives are truth-functional is false either way.)

To the extent that the notion of “extensional sentence” is left unclear, the precise significance of the slingshot remains slightly fuzzy. Nonetheless, Neale has brought impressive clarity to the subject. No one with an interest in intensionality or the semantics of descriptions will want to miss this book.


Barwise, J., and J. Perry (1981). “Semantic Innocence and Uncompromising Situations.” Midwest Studies in Philosophy 6:387-404.

Church, A. (1943). “Review of R. Carnap, Introduction to Semantics.” Philosophical Review 52: 298-304.

Davidson, D. (1967). “Truth and Meaning.” Synthese 17: 304-23.

Gödel, K. (1944). “Russell’s Mathematical Logic.” In The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, ed. P. A. Schilpp (Evanston: Northwestern University Press), 125-53.

Neale, S. (1990). Descriptions. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Neale, S. (1995). “The Philosophical Significance of Gödel’s Slingshot.” Mind 104: 761-825.