Facing Nature: Levinas and Environmental Thought

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William Edelglass, James Hatley, and Christian Diehm (eds.), Facing Nature: Levinas and Environmental Thought, Duquesne University Press, 2012, 359pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780820704531.

Reviewed by Joshua Shaw, Penn State Erie, The Behrend College


Facing Nature is a new collection of essays which examines the relevance of Emmanuel Levinas's philosophy for environmental thought. It contains thirteen essays on topics such as Levinas's perspective on the moral standing of nonhuman nature, the relevance of his account of responsibility for environmental ethics, and the similarities and differences between his account of nature and those of other figures in continental philosophy. I must confess that I initially approached the task of reviewing this collection with trepidation. For reasons I explain later, I was skeptical of the value of a collection of essays on Levinas's relevance for environmentalism. However, I was pleasantly surprised by the quality of the essays, and I would argue that it makes important contributions to the existing scholarship on Levinas's perspective on the moral standing of non-human nature and opens up new areas of scholarship on his relevance for environmentalism.

I find it difficult when reviewing anthologies to summarize their contents, given the range of claims each contributor can develop. For this reason, I will not attempt to summarize the contents of Facing Nature. Instead, I begin by offering some context for this anthology by identifying tendencies in the secondary literature on Levinas's perspective on the moral standing of nonhuman nature. This context will help me explain why I was wary of Facing Nature but also why I have come to regard it as a significant contribution to the scholarship on Levinas.

This is, to my knowledge, the first English-language collection that specifically examines Levinas's relevance for environmentalism. However, there is a substantial body of secondary literature on this topic. John Llewelyn deserves credit for publishing some of the first English-language pieces on the subject in the early nineties, such as "Am I Obsessed with Bobby? (Humanism of the Other Animal)" and the interpretation of Levinas he developed in The Middle Voice of Ecological Conscience, both of which were published in 1991. Since then, several scholars (including Peter Atterton, Matthew Calarco, Edward Casey, Alphonso Lingis, and David Wood, to name only a few)  have questioned whether Levinas' account of ethical responsibility has any relevance for animal rights and environmentalism.

I would argue that one finds a growing consensus in these publications that Levinas's account of responsibility is, at best, underdeveloped or, at worst, objectionably anthropocentric in its treatment of the ethical standing of nonhuman nature. Levinas is one of the leading figures responsible for inspiring the "ethical turn" in continental philosophy. However, he unfailingly equates ethical responsibility with interpersonal relationships in his major works -- face-to-face encounters with a human other. His remarks on the moral standing of animals and on nature more generally are confined to two short, seemingly inconsequential pieces: a 1986 interview with graduate students from the University of Warwick, published under the title "The Paradox of Morality," and a brief, confessional piece, "The Name of a Dog, or Natural Rights."

Scholars who have examined these pieces have tended to fall into two camps. First, there are critics who claim that his ethics is, in Matthew Calarcao's words, "dogmatically anthropocentric" and that its anthropocentrism is symptomatic of larger flaws in his thinking. Second, there are apologists who admit that his scant remarks on the moral standing of animals and the environment are frustratingly inconclusive but who suggest that ideas he developed in his major works have significance for environmentalism. For example, Levinas famously sought to develop an account of responsibility that was not based on or delimited by any restrictive epistemological or ontological theses. Apologists have proposed that this account lends itself to a robustly non-anthropocentric model of ethical responsibility, even if Levinas himself did not recognize it and even if he, personally, expressed concerns about non-anthropocentric, anti-humanist philosophies.

I mention this context because it helps explain my initial skepticism about Facing Nature. The consensus that seems to have developed over two decades that he was not at his best when reflecting on animal rights or environmentalism. But if that's the case, then why publish more essays on the subject? If the consensus is that his ethics is, at worst, dogmatically anthropocentric or, at best, underdeveloped in its applicability for environmentalism, why devote more scholarly attention to these aspects of his thinking? It seemed to me that a collection on his relevance for environmental thought would need to break new ground. I worried that, instead, the essays in Facing Nature would retread familiar territory, either obsessively re-emphasizing passages where he seems anthropocentric or pointing out, yet again, that his explicit remarks on the ethical standing of nonhuman nature are frustratingly underdeveloped.

I also had a second concern. As noted above, much of the scholarship on Levinas's ideas about the moral standing of nonhuman nature has focused on "The Name of a Dog" and "The Paradox of Morality." However, one does find suggestive passages elsewhere in his writings. There are his discussions about the "there is" -- the horror he believed we can experience at the sheer, nauseating plentitude of the world's facticity. There are his remarks in Totality and Infinity on how we experience our lived environment as a source of enjoyment, or jouissance, as well as his account of dwelling. There are passages in which he criticizes Heidegger's anti-humanism, which has been inspirational for some proponents of deep ecology. He also comments fleetingly in "The Ego and the Totality" on a form of "animal freedom" that he describes as "wild, faceless." I hoped that the essays in Facing Nature would expand the discussion about his relevance for environmental thought beyond the somewhat obsessive focus on the two pieces in which he comments briefly on the moral standing of animals.

I was pleasantly surprised by how well the essays in Facing Nature addressed these concerns. Several explicitly attempt to move beyond the consensus interpretations of Levinas. For example, Diane Perpich argues in "Scarce Resources? Levinas, Animals, and the Environment" that both his critics and his apologists share a common misconception about the role that "the face" plays in his thinking, and she proposes that environmental issues are better understood as matters that register at the level of what Levinas called "politics" rather than "ethics." Doug Halls similarly begins his essay, "Agency, Vulnerability, and Societas," by noting that much of the existing scholarship has focused on a single question: Is it possible to have face-to-face encounters with animals? He also argues that Levinas's account of politics lends itself to a more productive approach to environmental issues. While I may disagree about some claims that Perpich and Halls make in their essays, I found it refreshing to read pieces which explicitly try to move beyond the consensus interpretations of Levinas' beliefs about the moral standing of nonhuman nature.

Another example can be found in Eric Sean Nelson's essay, "Levinas and Adorno: Can There Be an Ethics of Nature?" Nelson engages in a comparative analysis of Levinas's and Adorno's ideas about nature, but he also shows how both were appropriately wary of discourses which depict nature as nonsocial and unalterable. Once again, I may not agree with some of the specifics of Nelson's interpretation of Levinas, but it was refreshing to read a piece in which his philosophy is neither rejected as dogmatically anthropocentric nor recast as implicitly non-anthropocentric, but, instead, presented as evincing an appropriately skeptical stance toward "nature" as a cultural category.

Several essays also make progress in this area by identifying how ideas in Levinas's writings can be conveyed in specific types of environmental ethics and in specific environmental policies. Much of the focus in Levinas scholarship has been on what I would characterize as a metaethical question: Do animals and the environment have moral standing? Several essays in Facing Nature move beyond this issue by addressing more of a normative ethical question: How might a Leviansian environmentalism be put into practice? For example, Christian Diehm's "Alterity, Value, Autonomy: Levinas and Environmental Ethics" clarifies where Levinas's ethics might fit in terms of established positions in environmental philosophy, and convincingly argues, in my estimation, that Levinas lines up most closely with a form of "biocentric individualism" that differs significantly from the "extentionist" ethics found in Peter Singer's and Tom Regan's writings.  

J. Aaron Simmons's "Toward a Relational Model of Anthropocentrism" is also a good example. Simmons is concerned to prove that human-caused climate change should be considered an overriding ethical emergency. He argues that Levinas develops a "relational model of anthropocentrism," an ethics that is anthropocentric while avoiding the pitfalls of many forms of anthropocentrism, and one that, importantly, lends itself to a convincing defense of the claim that human-caused climate change is an overriding ethical emergency. William Edelglass's essay, "Rethinking Responsibility in An Age of Antrhopogenic Climate Change," makes a similar use of Levinas's writings. Edelglass draws on Levinas's account of responsibility to support the claim that we, as individuals, each bear responsibility for the sufferings caused by climate change.

The second concern I raised was the tendency among commentators to focus almost exclusively on the two scant pieces in which Levinas explicitly discusses the moral standing of animals. I was pleased to find several contributors drawing attention to underappreciated passages elsewhere in his writings. For example, Ted Toadvine's essay, "Enjoyment and Its Discontents: On Separation from Nature in Levinas," canvases Levinas's discussions in several writings about topics such as enjoyment, the body, elements, dwelling, and the "there is" in order to clarify the central role that separation from nature plays in his thinking and how it shapes his perspective on the ethical standing of nature. James Hatley's "The Anarchical Goodness of Creation: Monotheism in Another's Voice"discusses several significant passages from Otherwise than Being in which Levinas reflects on the creation story  And Eric Sean Nelson draws attention to several pieces in which Levinas critiques Heidegger's characterizations of nature, pieces such as "Heidegger, Gargarin and Us" and "Philosophy of Hitlerism." I should also note that I was impressed by the quality of the essays in which authors commented on "The Name of a Dog" and "The Paradox of Morality. I approached Facing Nature hoping that it would not contain yet more hairsplitting analyses of these two pieces, but I was pleasantly surprised by, for example, the subtlety of Doug Halls's interpretation of "The Name of a Dog".

This is not to say that Facing Nature is beyond criticism. The quality of the essays in it is uneven, with some better than others. I would argue, too, that there is a tendency in continental philosophy for scholars to write mainly exegetical essays in which they confine themselves to simply comparing and contrasting figures in continental philosophy. Facing Nature contains its share of this type of essay: Levinas and Adorno, Levinas and Arendt, Levinas and Merleau-Ponty, Levinas and Thoreau. However, other readers will likely not share this aversion. Also, several of these comparative essays are, I should emphasize, quite informative. I greatly enjoyed Edward Mooney and Lyman Mower's thoughtful reflection, "Witness to the Face of a River: Thinking with Levinas and Thoreau." Readers interested in the relationship between Levinas's thought and that of Adorno and Merleau-Ponty will also benefit from, respectively, Eric Sean Nelson's and Ted Toadvine's essays, both of which make important contributions to the comparative studies of these thinkers.

Finally, I would like to have seen more dialogue between continental and analytic philosophy, on environmentalism. There are eferences to Peter Singer and Tom Reagan but, unfortunately, no discussions of, say, J. Baird Callicott's land ethic environmentalism or of Cora Diamond's essays on animal rights and vegetarianism. Again, though, this criticism will not be shared by all, and some may be more put off by the lack of references to certain pieces by figures in continental philosophy on animal rights and environmentalism, such as Derrida's The Animal that Therefore I Am and "'Eating Well' or the Calculation of the Subject," both of which are barely mentioned, or Donna Haraway's When Species Meet and The Companion Species Manifesto, which are not discussed.

However, these are small criticisms of what is, overall, a very strong collection. Facing Nature breaks some new ground in the existing literature on Levinas's perspective on the moral standing of nonhuman nature. It also opens up several new areas of scholarship on his relevance for environmental thought. The strength of the essays make it a "must read," alongside now canonical works such as John Llewelyn's Middle Voice of Ecological Conscience, for scholars interested in applying Levinas's seemingly anthropocentric ethical philosophy to areas of study in environmentalism and animal rights.