Facing Up to Scarcity: The Logic and Limits of Nonconsequentialist Thought

Facing Up To Scarcity

Barbara H. Fried, Facing Up to Scarcity: The Logic and Limits of Nonconsequentialist Thought, Oxford University Press, 2020, 269pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198847878.

Reviewed by Peter Vallentyne, University of Missouri


Barbara H. Fried (a law professor at Stanford) has published extensively on theories of distributive justice. This book consists of revised versions of ten previously published articles (1995-2020) plus three new chapters. The main focus is on presenting arguments against the following: (1) attaching much moral significance to highly simplified thought experiments (e.g., trolley problems), (2) John Rawls' contractualist account of justice, especially his appeal to maximin/leximin reasoning behind the veil of ignorance, (3) T.M. Scanlon's contractualist account of moral permissibility, (4) social (i.e., Hobbesian or quasi-libertarian) contractarian accounts of moral permissibility or justice, (5) Robert Nozick's right-libertarian theory, and (6) left-libertarianism. These critiques are largely internal in that they accept the core commitments of the view addressed and argue either that those views are inconsistent or that commonly assumed implications do not follow. There is also a chapter criticizing non-consequentialist analyses of tort law and a chapter on benefits taxation (i.e., taxation on the basis of the value of the government benefits consumed).

A running theme is that any adequate moral or political theory must base the moral permissibility (or justice) of options on their consequences assessed in part by how well they promote aggregate individual wellbeing (involving interpersonal tradeoffs).

My comments below will focus on: (1) the methodological role of simplified thought experiments in moral philosophy, (2) objective vs. epistemic moral assessment and their relation to ex ante vs. ex post moral assessment, and (3) the role of interpersonal tradeoffs of individual wellbeing for moral permissibility and justice. First, however, I'll very briefly mention some of the main claims made by Fried on the above topics.

With respect to maximin/leximin reasoning, Fried rightly criticizes Rawls's contractualist assumption that the individual parties in the original position will choose principles based on maximizing the value of the worst possible outcome for themselves. She also criticizes Scanlon's original contractualist assumption that choices need to be justifiable to all reasonably motivated persons based on the resulting outcome, which in a world of uncertainty/risk will not be determined at the time of action. Finally, although Fried judges later Scanlonian contractualism (e.g., developed by Scanlon, Johann Frick, Aaron James, and Raul Kumar) to be an improvement (because it makes the individual assessments of choices be ex ante assessments), she argues that the lexical priority given to the (ex ante) assessment of the worst off person implausibly blocks the possibility of morally acceptable tradeoffs among persons (e.g., a significant benefit for a billion vs. a very small sacrifice for the worst off person). Note that the first two objections are to prudential assessment of choices based on the worst possible outcome for the individual, whereas the last objection is to moral assessment of choices based solely on the assessment of the worst-off person (except to break ties).

With respect to social (Hobbesian, quasi-libertarian) contractarianism (e.g., the theories of James Buchanan, David Gauthier, or Jan Narveson), Fried argues that the most plausible versions may not be very far apart from the most plausible versions of Rawlsian contractualism. They all agree on the lexical priority of liberty. Rawlsian accommodation of the strains of commitment, choice-sensitive egalitarianism, and sufficientarianism (in place of maximin) will push Rawls' theory in the direction of quasi-libertarianism. Moreover, social contractarian accommodation of the requirements of rectification for past injustices, compulsory taxation to fund public goods, and the regulation of negative externalities will push their views in the direction of Rawlsian principles. Fried also argues that (1) the most plausible version of social contractarianism will be based on a realistic non-agreement point (i.e., based on existing social arrangements), and (2) social contractarians have so far failed to take into account the significant costs that the more fortunate members of society would bear if they were to withdraw from existing cooperative arrangements.

With respect to Nozick's libertarian theory, Fried criticizes the implausibility (on libertarian grounds) and internal inconsistency of Nozick's views on the impermissibility of a mere risk of rights-infringements (which enable Nozick to claim that a dominant protection agency does not violate rights when it forcibly prevents other protections agencies from operating, because they impose a risk of acting unjustly). She also criticizes Nozick's discussion of justice in transfer (especially his famous Wilt Chamberlain example) as begging the question of what transfer rights individuals have.

With respect to left-libertarianism (e.g., that of Hillel Steiner, Michael Otsuka, or myself), Fried argues that the thesis of full self-ownership has no determinate core and hence can't do the work assigned to it (by left-libertarians or right-libertarians). For example, she claims that blowing smoke in another's face does not determinately infringe that person's self-ownership. She further argues that the left-libertarian egalitarian interpretation of the Lockean proviso threatens to eliminate the distinction between left-libertarianism and conventional (liberal) egalitarianism. In particular, Fried claims that, given left-libertarianism's egalitarian commitment to distributing the value of natural resources in some egalitarian fashion, there is little, if any, role for full self-ownership to play.

I turn now turn to some critical comments, each on a big picture issue.

My first criticism is that Fried is too quick to dismiss moral methodologies that involve artificially simple cases. She calls these simple cases "trolley problems", but traditional trolley cases are but one example of what she has in mind. Her focus is on artificial choice situations with several of the following features: (1) there is a small number of feasible alternatives, with outcomes that are certain (no risk or uncertainty); (2) there is a small number of affected people, each of whom is ex ante identifiable; (3) no consideration is given to how the choice of the agent might affect the future choices that they or other agents might make; and (4) the agent has full knowledge of all the relevant facts.

I agree with Fried that appealing only to such artificially simple cases provides little or no justification for any moral principles. Almost no moral philosopher, however, believes otherwise. Most would endorse some kind of wide reflective equilibrium methodology, according to which considered judgments about abstract principles and about concrete cases are both relevant. Moreover, the relevant concrete cases include all real-life cases, as well artificially simple hypothetical ones. Fried, however, rejects any appeal to assessments based on artificially simple hypothetical cases. She rightly claims that they are manipulable and often not generalizable. This, however, is also true of assessments of concrete real-life cases, although perhaps less so. If the latter are relevant (provisional) data points, then so are the former. Moreover, consideration of artificially simple cases permits theorists to focus on the implications of key variables in the absence of confounding variables. Thus, there is some real benefit to considering them as well. Both are subject, however, to reassessment in light of plausible abstract principles. Thus, most moral theorists endorse some kind of appeal to reflective equilibrium over both concrete judgments about cases (real-life and hypothetical) and judgments about abstract principles. In short, I agree with Fried about the dangers of relying solely on judgments in artificially simple choice situations. The remedy, however, is not to ignore them. It's to bring in more data -- about a wide range of concrete cases (both real-life and hypothetical) and about a wide range of competing abstract principles.

My second criticism is that Fried seems to run together ex ante moral assessment of options with epistemic/subjective moral assessment from the agent's perspective. I agree with her that the relevant evaluation of the permissibility of action is ex ante and does not depend on how things happen to turn out. This ex ante perspective need not, however, be the agent's epistemically limited perspective. It can be based on the objective facts, where the objective probabilities will all be 0 or 1, if the world is fully deterministic, but the probabilities can take intermediate values if the laws of nature are objectively probabilistic. These objective facts determine what is objectively permissible. Such moral theories are not directly action-guiding, since the agent does not have epistemic access to all the relevant moral and empirical facts, but they are indirectly action-guiding in the sense that, if the agent knows what the objectively correct (ex ante) moral principles are (I here ignore the significant problem of moral uncertainty), they can make an assessment, relative to their evidence, of which actions satisfy those principles. Blameworthiness is, of course, relative to the agent's evidence, but moral permissibility is not. Fried is not alone in endorsing an epistemically-based conception of basic moral permissibility. I'm just noting my disagreement.

Related to this, Fried claims (p. 11) that consequentialists are generally committed to ex ante epistemic evaluation and that non-consequentialists are generally committed to some kind of ex post evaluation. This seems quite mistaken. Some consequentialists (mistakenly in my view) invoke an ex post evaluation (e.g., wrong to make a certain gamble, if bad results are realized, but permissible to make it if good results are realized), and many (correctly in my view) invoke an objective evaluation (based on the facts at the time of choice, including the objective probabilities over the outcomes of the feasible choices). Moreover, many non-consequentialists invoke an ex ante evaluation (e.g., whether an agent's action infringes someone's rights is determined at the time of action, not on how things turn out). So, these two distinctions need to be kept separate.

My third critical comment concerns Fried's assumptions about the relationship between (e.g., act) consequentialism, welfarism, interpersonal tradeoffs of wellbeing, and aggregation. She often seems to run these together (e.g., Ch. 1), but each is distinct. Act consequentialism is the view that the moral permissibility of an action is fully determined by whether its consequences are sufficiently (e.g., maximally) morally good. Moral goodness need not be based solely (or at all) on how well the wellbeing of individuals is promoted (although I agree with Fried that the most plausible view is so based). Moreover, if it is so based, it need not be based on interpersonal tradeoffs. An (implausible) view that holds that an action is permissible if and only if it is Pareto optimal (i.e., not possible to make anyone better off without making someone worse off) is a welfaristic consequentialist theory that makes no interpersonal tradeoffs. (Again, I agree with Fried that only theories that make some tradeoffs are plausible.) Even if a theory makes interpersonal tradeoffs, it need not be aggregative with respect to lives. Leximin (or maximin) makes interpersonal tradeoffs in favor of the less advantaged, but it is not aggregative, since it always favors the worst off (and hence the numbers don't count, except in special cases of ties). Finally, aggregative moral theories need not be utilitarian. Theories that require maximizing desert-weighted, equality-weighted, or prioritarian-weighted wellbeing are aggregative (and consequentialist, pace p. 108), but not utilitarian. This is all just terminological, but these are important distinctions that Fried does not adequately recognize.

Fried has lots of insightful discussion of the above issues, but her terminology is sometimes off, and she often moves too quickly. Still, readers with interests in these topics will benefit from reading this book.