Facts and Values: The Ethics and Metaphysics of Normativity

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Giancarlo Marchetti and Sarin Marchetti (eds.), Facts and Values: The Ethics and Metaphysics of Normativity, Routledge, 2017, 297pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138955516.

Reviewed by Neil Sinclair, University of Nottingham


This volume seeks to provide a critical perspective on the supposed fact/value distinction. In fact, it aims to provide multiple critiques of this 'absolute dichotomy', based in at least three disparate intellectual traditions: pragmatism, critical theory and analytic meta-ethics. The volume contains multiple representatives of each tradition, as well as chapters on the philosophy of law and environmental ethics. It is aimed at advanced scholars and dedicated to Hilary Putnam, whose essay on the collapse of the fact/value dichotomy is essential background for many of the papers. I think it only partially succeeds in meeting its aim, owing largely to the thematic fragmentation of the chapters. For all that, there are several excellent papers here, worth reading irrespective of their thematic connections. These last two claims are, of course, just my personal value judgement, with which you are free to disagree (more on that in a moment). In what follows I outline key claims of most of the collected papers (unfortunately they are too many, and too diverse, to all be discussed), highlighting recurring themes and providing brief evaluation. In the final paragraphs, I return to the assessment of the volume as a whole.

Both modern philosophy and modern culture manifest a tendency to distinguish between facts and values. Detectives, law courts and scientists are keen to establish the 'bare facts', untainted by projected values, subjective biases or emotional colouring. Conversely, treating a proclamation as 'just a value judgement' is often a way of licensing faultless disagreement. Objective investigation is best kept free of values, which in turn are not the appropriate focus for objective investigation. Or so popular thought goes. But can this division be sustained?

One difficulty in answering this question is that it depends on how precisely the distinction is understood. Pulling apart the various threads is one aim of the editors' introduction. They provide a litany of notions associated with each side of the divide (1-3):

Facts: empirical verification, truth, explanation, science, natural, objectivity, descriptive, cognitive, rationality, superior.

Values: empirically unverifiable, objectively unjustifiable, ethics, subjective, relative, evaluative, prescriptive, emotion, arational, subordinate.

There follows a history of this distinction under various guides, from the Humean injunction against deriving an 'ought' from an 'is', through variations of ethical non-cognitivism, to different types of usage in 'use' theories of meaning. Opposition to the distinction (and defence of 'fact-value entanglement') is exemplified by pragmatists such as Peirce, James and Dewey, and in particular their rejection of the so-called 'representationalist' model of knowledge, according to which 'human understanding [is] a matter of faithful mirroring [of] a reality which is brute and deaf to our requests' (13). One difficulty I had with this survey is that it privileges history over taxonomy, hence the interconnections between the various ways of making the distinction are not clearly set out, nor is there a detailed introduction to the remaining papers.

Part I ('A Counter-History of the Dichotomy') aims to provide a history of critique of the dichotomy, focusing on the work of classical pragmatists (papers by H. Putnam and Robert Schwartz) and critical theorists (papers by Maeve Cooke and John McGuire). Putnam's own contribution explores Dewey's opposition to the flag bearers of the fact/value dichotomy of his day -- logical positivists such as Carnap, Reichenbach and Ayer. Putnam sees Dewey as targeting a fact/value distinction according to which matters of fact are subject to rational argument and evaluation, but value judgements (expressing only pseudo-propositions) are not (28). Against this, Putnam notes that pragmatists have a positive view of the role of reason in ethical inquiry, although in typically fallibilistic mode this is not as an Archimedean point prior to and outside of all existing evaluation, but a self-reflective 'careful evaluation of experience and the invention of new descriptions of experience' (39). Hence

The right approach to our ethical problems is neither to give up the very possibility of intelligent discussion nor to seek a metaphysical foundation outside of . . . all problematic situations, but to investigate and discuss and try things out cooperatively, democratically, and above all fallibilistically. The terrible thing about the fact/value dichotomy is that by denying that there is such a thing as a responsible and rational ethical discussion, it "blocks the path of inquiry" from the very start (39).

Putnam's essay is historically exegetical, and the fact/value dichotomy in its cross-hairs seems historically idiosyncratic and directly opposed by later thinkers within the non-cognitivist tradition, such as C. L. Stevenson, Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard. (Sadly only two of the papers in the volume engage with Stevenson's excellent collection of the same name.)

Like Putnam, Schwartz (in 'Pragmatic Constructivism: Values, Norms and Obligations') seeks to emphasise the continuity in form between evaluative and theoretical inquiry. The aim is to defend a Dewey-inspired 'pragmatic constructivism': 'constructivist' insofar as it holds that 'the source and justification of ethical claims lies within' and 'pragmatic' insofar as it acknowledges that 'ethical inquiry per se is not significantly different from theoretical deliberation' (43). Furthermore, theoretical deliberation is anti-foundationalist insofar as it 'starts in the middle of things', fallibilist insofar as 'even our best theories are likely to be challenged' and progressive rather than idealistic, insofar as the guiding light of inquiry is not final or absolute truth, but progress, understood as 'what we settle for and evaluate' (44). The resulting view of moral judgement and inquiry is that:

We . . . start with the facts of human moral valuing . . . As reflective beings, we evaluate what is morally valuable, by looking at the consequences of experiencing something as being of value. Judgments of what is valuable . . . like all judgements . . . are subject to challenges that may lead to improvement or rejection. The stimuli to engage in moral inquiry are problems that arise with our current commitments. . . . To be applicable to life as lived, we must seek accommodations. Indeed, progress arises out of conflict and accommodation (46-47).

Like Putnam, Schwartz emphasises that moral inquiry works fallibilistically from within and yet is inherently social.

The next two contributions engage deeply with the work of critical theorists in the Frankfurt-School tradition. Cooke ('Contingency and Objectivity in Critical Social Theory: Horkheimer and Habermas') addresses a potential problem for critical theory, understood as a broadly Marxist theory of social conditions which sees itself as an essential agent of social transformation. The problem stems from theory's acceptance of contingent facts (about prevailing social conditions) and objective values (those facts can change for the better). The solution involves a new model of ethical validity which -- contrary to the pragmatist view -- is 'context-transcending' and 'outside' deliberation. In 'From the Positivismusstreit to Putnam: Facts and Values in the Shadow of Dichotomy', McGuire's aim, like Putnam's, is to 'retrace the toxic legacy of positivism', but with particular emphasis on arriving at 'a clearer picture of how the products of philosophical reasoning . . . escape the cloistered discourse of expertise' (80). In a conclusion which aims to transcend the debate between Putnam and Habermas, McGuire argues that 'what ultimately needs to be overturned is not any one particular intellectual legacy (whether positivist or Kantian or Neo-Aristotelian) but rather the underlying passive model of acculturation itself' (96-97). Neither of these two papers tackle to fact/value dichotomy head-on, and both are steeped in the terminology and background of the critical theory tradition they contribute to, making them somewhat daunting to the uninitiated.

Part II ('Varieties of Entanglement') is advertised as a 'wide selection of strategies for dissolving [the] dichotomy, employing many different philosophical languages' (19). Ruth Anna Putnam ('Reflections Concerning Moral Objectivity') defends both factual and evaluate inquiry as 'objective'. Here 'objectivity' is understood through the pragmatism of James and Peirce: 'Because we act on our beliefs . . . we want our beliefs to be true . . . And we realise that certain ways of arriving at our beliefs . . . make it more likely that our beliefs are true than do other ways. Beliefs arrived up by such methods are objective' (108). In response to doubts about the objectivity of value judgements, and following Dewey, Putnam defends the view that 'we can and do reason about ends', citing as proof Aristotle's 'sustained argument for a certain kind of life -- eudaimonia -- as one's ultimate end' (113). Furthermore the search for objectivity in the particular case of moral judgements is connected with our need for moral norms to regulate interpersonal co-ordination (115-116), and this understanding of the source of moral objectivity in turn gives rise to distinct obligations regarding the means by which we seek moral consensus (roughly, obligations of impartial sympathy; 117). As with H. Putnam, the targeted dichotomy here seems to be the positivist position that evaluative debates are not amenable to reasoning of any kind.

In common with most of the other papers discussed so far, Carla Bagnoli's contribution ('Sensitivity to Facts and Prospective Rationality') traces the effects of the fact/value dichotomy on the form of inquiry. Bagnoli aims to show that 'The impact of the collapse of the fact/value dichotomy can be fully appreciated by considering how it reshapes the account of practical reasoning' (141). According to the non-cognitivist view which takes facts and values to be radically different in nature, practical reasoning is proceduralist: a matter of formal procedures applied to bare facts. The target here is Hare's brand of non-cognitivism, which holds that 'the logic of moral language, together with the relevant facts of the matter, generate a framework of reasoning that should sort out all the questions of ethics' (140). The problem is that many 'changes in view' involve more than simply acquiring new information. There are also such things as the development and re-evaluation of emotional ties, and here Bagnoli has some nice examples (142-143). The non-proceduralist ('constructivist') account of practical reasoning that is a consequence of rejecting the fact/value dichotomy is 'transformative' in the tradition of Murdoch and Gilbert Harman. It views reasoning ' . . . as an activity . . . in which reasoners produce a change in view [that] is not linear, and . . . is to be distinguished from arguments and proofs' (151-152). Hence 'the "change in view" is a complex perspectival change, which is the result of the networking of discursive and emotional capacities', i.e. the entanglement of (one's view of the) facts and (one's psychological) values (152). As with previous contributions, the defenders of dichotomy in the cross-hairs of this attack are historical, in this case Hare and Urmson.

Naomi Scheman's paper ('On Mattering') discusses a previously unremarked way of understanding the fact/value dichotomy, as the distinction between motivationally inert yet doxastically potent facts and motivationally potent yet doxastically inert values -- where to say facts are motivationally inert is to say that they (rationally) compel no motivational response (119). Scheman argues that some facts are motivationally potent, paradoxically 'revealed by some people's refusal . . . to recognize . . . them' (119). The thought is that unsettling facts motivate ignorance of those very facts, so that 'we fail to notice what, being noticed, would tell us that we must change our lives' (122). This point is linked to the field of epistemologies of ignorance, with examples such as the systematic discounting of testimony highlighted by the Black Lives Matter movement (123). Nevertheless Scheman admits that 'the facts carry the force that they do [only] against a background of shared values . . . so . . . the bare facts on their own might well be motivationally inert' (122-123).

There follow two papers firmly located within contemporary analytic meta-ethics. Both clearly relate to the fact/value dichotomy without tackling the issue head-on. Alex Miller's ('Normativity without Normative Facts? A Critique of Cognitive Expressivism' is a laser-guided attack on Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons' 'cognitive expressivism' -- the view that moral judgements express non-descriptive beliefs, that is beliefs whose primary function is motivational (160-161). The advantage of such views, it is claimed, is that they capture the apparently cognitive, assertoric nature of moral discourse, without committing to ontologically problematic moral facts (159-161). Miller argues that cognitive expressivism can either be considered a version of Wright's minimalism -- in which case it is problematic because, unlike Wright's, it does not develop any 'realism relevant cruxes' which can distinguish the minimal moral facts it wants to accept from the robust moral facts it wants to deny (164). Or it can be considered a version of Blackburn's quasi-realism, in which case it fails to answer the well-known Frege-Geach problem. The latter arises because, in trying to explain logical relations between moral sentences, cognitive expressivism helps itself to the very logical notions requiring vindication (Miller provides an exemplary elucidation of this particular example of theft over toil).

In contrast to Miller's precise demolition, Mauro Rossi and Christine Tappolet seek to construct a positive theory. Their 'The Evolutionary Debunker Meets Sentimental Realism' elucidates the view that there are objective evaluative facts and that emotions are perceptions of such facts. At its core is a response-dependent elucidation of ethical concepts according to which, for example, X is admirable just in case admiration of X is appropriate. Further, admiration of X is appropriate just in case it represents this evaluative fact (viz., the admirability of X) as it really is. The resulting circularity is innocuous, according to Rossi and Tappolet, since the aim is not reduction but rather illumination of the epistemology of values: 'that when we try to find out whether something is admirable or shameful . . . there is nothing more fundamental to appeal to than our responses of admiration and shame' (178). The main action in the rest of the paper is to show that sentimental realism can adopt an Enoch-style 'third-factor' response to the would-be evolutionary debunker, and Rossi and Tappolet diligently adapt this response to fit their own brand of realism. As with the conclusions of the two previous papers, I worried whether this result lived up its billing as an attack on the fact value/dichotomy, since it remains compatible with a deep psychological and epistemological distinction between judgements of fact and judgements of value.

The next paper -- Kenneth Taylor's 'How to be a Relativist' -- is a highlight. Taylor defends a version of relativism according to which 'nothing but our taking a thing to have normative status makes it . . . have that status' (223). But he holds that in pursuing the naturalistically explicable goal of seeking broad normative community, agents can self-entitle themselves to hold others to norms which the others do not endorse. The result is a type of 'intolerant relativism' which sidesteps worries about laissez-faire moral degeneracy (197). Furthermore, like the pragmatists discussed earlier, this view rejects the idea that self-entitlement requires any sort of external validation: 'There is only the normative authority that lies within each of us' (222). Taylor emphasises that the resulting view can explain why there are genuine moral disputes, and why we treat such disputes as rationally resolvable, whilst also recognising that such disputes can be intractable (222-224; there are clear though unremarked echoes of Stevenson's Facts and Values here). With characteristic insight Taylor highlights the possible misuses of the Archimedean point:

To silence the resisting other, we posit a final judge, an external authority that trumps all rational resistance. And we declare that the final judge has decided for our side. This declaration serves as a club with which we can beat down the resisting other. And if the resisting other will not be silent, we declare that reason has gone silent . . .  (224).

One might question again the fit between Taylor's arguments and the avowed theme of the volume, since Taylor draws a clear psychological distinction between our beliefs -- which go 'on parade, in search of external vindication' -- and normative commitments -- which are 'not . . . answerable to anything antecedently present within that upon which a [normative] status is conferred' (223).

The final part of the volume is advertised as applications of fact/value entanglement but only Douglas Lind's 'Fact/Value Complexes in Law and Judicial Decision' lives up to the billing. In an accessible and thought-provoking argument, Lind traces the consequences of accepting (or rejecting) the fact/value dichotomy for the 'the most enduring problem in jurisprudence: defining the function, scope, and limits of judicial power' (265). He argues that fact/value entanglement, and in particular the presence of fact/value complexes in many legal precepts, provides the basis of a new case against legal formalism -- the 'judge-proof' view of law which sees the judge's role as simply drawing logical deductions from the major premises of value-enshrining legislation and the minor premises of courtroom-established facts (267). Suggesting that the mixing of facts and values is ubiquitous in legal precepts, Lind concludes that: 'the practice of judicial decision-making unavoidably requires judges to engage with the substantive content and underlying values and policies embedded in legal precepts' (288).

Now for evaluation. As already mentioned, this volume is diverse, in both style and content (and unfortunately, in standards of proofing). It provides an invigorating introduction to a vast range of debates concerning the supposed fact/value dichotomy. But not unrelatedly there is some lack of unity and clarity regarding that dichotomy. For some authors (e.g., Putnam, Putnam and Schwartz) the dichotomy is between two modes of inquiry; for others (Bagnoli, Lind) it is between two different types of input into purely formal deliberation. For some (Scheman, Miller) the dichotomy is between different modes of being, for others (Rossi and Tappolet) between different modes of knowing, and for still more others (Taylor) between two types of psychological state. Furthermore, some of the earlier papers focus on a positivistic version of the distinction which is perhaps only of historical interest. I felt that interesting connections between these multiple distinctions were never sufficiently explored. In addition, many papers assume a great deal of background knowledge (including knowledge of which particular fact/value distinction is pertinent), and these backgrounds often do not overlap. The result is that while the volume may contain something for everyone, it is unlikely that there is anyone for whom everything in it would be useful.

That said, the papers by Miller, Rossi and Tappolet, Taylor and Lind are all excellent, original and insightful contributions to contemporary ongoing debates. And perhaps thematic fragmentation is inevitable given the subject matter and ambition of such a volume. It is often said that the discipline of academic philosophy is suffering from overspecialisation and compartmentalisation. Nebulous, culturally-resonant themes like the fact/value dichotomy provide a sufficiently large canvas to overcome these problems, and the editors must be congratulated for putting together a volume which attempts to bring different traditions together. But while this volume does succeed in getting various pragmatists, critical theorists and analytic metaethicists out of their silos, it doesn't quite put them on the same page.