Fairness in Practice: A Social Contract for a Global Economy

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Aaron James, Fairness in Practice: A Social Contract for a Global Economy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 366pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199846153.

Reviewed by Gabriel Wollner, University of Bayreuth


What does fairness require of the global economy? This is the question addressed by Aaron James in Fairness in Practice -- A Social Contract for a Global Economy. His short answer is that fairness requires the global economy leave no individual worse off than he or she would be without it and the gains of trade be distributed equally first between all trading nations and second between all citizens within those nations. His longer answer develops four basic ideas: James' (1) preferred constructive method of moral justification, combined with (2) a particular interpretation of the existing social practice of international trade in goods, services and capital, delivers a (3) particular understanding of fairness as structural equity, which supports (4) a set of policy proposals for reforming the institutions of the global economy. Jointly, these elements of his argument hold a powerful promise. They are to overcome skepticism about both the significance and applicability of fairness concerns to a partially integrated and politically decentralized global economy.

The first part of the book lays the foundation of James' overall argument and sketches the themes that are developed more fully later on.

In Chapter 1, James explains his basic commitments and aspirations. Methodologically, he identifies his approach as within the tradition of Kantian or Rawlsian constructivism, constructing a moral argument about fairness building on an interpretation of the practice of international trade. Requirements of fairness arise as internal to the practice of international trade and come with a comparative concern for socio-economic outcomes that is distinct from both the concern of domestic egalitarianism and cosmopolitanism. The conception of fairness appropriate for the practice of international trade, for which James coins the name 'structural equity', comprises three principles. The 'principle of due care' requires that no individual is left worse off through international trade than he or she would be in a closed society. The 'international relative gains principle' requires that the gains of trade be distributed equally between all trading nations. And finally, the 'domestic relative gains principle' requires that the gains of trade should be distributed equally between individuals within each trading nation. James lays claim to the title of non-utopian theory and his account of fairness makes specific demands on real political actors, for example that they provide domestic social insurance as the fair price of free trade, that they introduce capital controls to prevent financial crises, that they modify the existing intellectual property rights regime and offer developing countries fair terms of economic integration.

Chapter 2 seeks to convince the skeptical economist that fairness is a requirement that applies to the social practice of international trade. James' key idea is that the economist's argument for free trade can succeed only if the practice of trade is sensitive to concerns of fairness. Three lines of reasoning support his claim. First, James argues that something like a social practice of international trade or common market reliance does indeed exist. The behavior of participants in that practice, e.g., national governments, is coordinated over time and the shared purpose of augmenting national income governs the participants' expectations. Second, the practice of trade or market reliance is embedded in an institutional context. Markets depend on non-market institutions that are socially created. And third, the case for trade made by economic theorists, most famously along the lines of trading to comparative advantage, has to rely on a notion of fairness in order to succeed. To justify trade to domestic losers, e.g., unemployed citizens previously working in manufacturing, free trade has to be accompanied by compensation and redistribution. The economic case for free trade building on national self-interest and efficiency may succeed only if the institutions that govern the practice of trade are sensitive to concerns of fairness.

Chapter 3 takes on a political or realist form of skepticism: why should nations constrain the pursuit of their own self-interest in recognition of norms of fairness or justice, if they cannot be assured that others will abide by these norms as well? James gives two arguments to convince the Hobbesian skeptic that duties of fair play, in particular of fidelity and fair governance, have a place in international trade. First, he argues that the basic assurance problem troubling the Hobbesian realist is already solved by the existence of a social practice. International trade is different from the state of nature because even though there is no coercive sovereign, there are social institutions that offer the type of assurance that nations are looking for. And second, James suggests that trading partners should be thought of in analogy to domestic legislators. Because they are the subjects and authors of rules they give to a joint activity, they face the problem of justifying the collective exercise of power, which is often thought to serve as a trigger for concerns of justice and fairness.

Chapter 4 builds on the Hobbesian picture developed in the previous chapter but puts it to a different use: the remaining force of the assurance problem establishes both the method and the substance of James' constructivist internationalism against the rival of cosmopolitan egalitarianism. James argues that normative political philosophy ought to be sensitive to basic epistemic circumstances and moral risks and offer 'conclusive reasons of action' to 'actual world regulators'. Given that the effects and hence the moral quality of one individual's acts depend on what others do, e.g., on whether or not they do their bit as well, while what others do is somewhat uncertain and beyond any one individual's control, the principles informing any one individual's action will depend on what others can reasonably be expected to do. Abstractly formulating normative principles would require a fundamentally different institutional alternative, the precise shape of which we may not even fully understand, and which will lead to the hoped for results only in case of universal compliance. Therefore, political philosophy of the right kind should begin from and address actors within the existing political and economic system. Hobbes' assurance problem properly understood does not quite deliver the need for coercive political authority but instead imposes constraints on the method of political theory. Constraints, James believes, that cosmopolitanism has not yet shown to be able to meet.

The second part of the book explains how fairness applies to the global economy and develops the substance of fairness as structural equity.

Chapter 5 offers a first outline of the idea of structural equity as it applies to the global economy. Three of its features are of particular importance. First, the idea of fairness as structural equity resembles the general complaint model familiar from contractualism in moral philosophy. To find a principle of fairness for the global economy that nobody could reasonably reject, one will have to identify the relevant interests of the global economy's participants, consider the various objections they could raise against all feasible alternatives, and proceed by pairwise comparison to arrive at the principle that would minimize the greatest individual complaint. Second, the idea of structural equity neither applies to particular interactions taking place within the global economy, nor does it capture an external moral concern. A concern for structural equity arises because of the global economy's existence, it applies to the structure of interaction over time, and it governs the overall distribution of benefits created by global trade. Finally, there is a non-foundational argument for structural equity thus understood. Fairness as structural equity gives unity to our otherwise disparate judgments about fairness in the global domain, including judgments about fair trade, fair wages and fair competition.

Chapters 6 and 7 defend the substantive requirements of structural equity and introduce three principles that nobody could reasonably reject as governing the practice of global trade. First, the 'international relative gains principle' states that subject to two qualifications, the gains of trade are to be distributed equally among trading nations. The two qualifications are these: some special claims, e.g., of absolute need, may justify a deviation from an equal division of the gains of trade delivering a more prioritarian version of the principle, and equal distributions ought to be endowment adjusted, i.e., gains that a country would have reaped under a regime of autarky ought to be factored out. James' argument for the benchmark of equality relies on the claims that trading countries are equal in status, that they have symmetrical interest in gaining from trade, and that there are no special prior entitlements to particular gains from trade. Second, trade would be unfair if it augmented national income at the cost of those who lose out domestically. The 'due care principle' requires that nobody is left worse off by a free trade regime than he or she would be under autarky. The only way of rendering free trade compatible with due care is through providing social insurance and a safety net. And finally, the 'domestic relative gains principle' requires that the fair share of national gains follow a particular distributive pattern domestically. Because citizens in trading countries have equal claims to the gains of trade which are previously unowned, these gains ought to be, absent special justification, distributed equally. James' responses to objections raised by advocates of alternative positions clarify his overall approach. The cosmopolitan challenge that the benchmark of equality in the distribution of relative gains should apply to individuals rather than nation states is dismissed emphasizing the interpretative nature of his approach: the resources of international law and economic theory merely support the internationalist perspective concerned with nation states. A cosmopolitan perspective would hence be overly revisionist of existing practice.

The final part of the book relies on the notion of structural equity to formulate policy proposals for reforming the institutions of the global economic order.

In Chapter 8, James argues that as a matter of fairness, international financial markets ought to be scaled back and capital account liberalization be undone. He believes that just like any highly risky and potentially beneficial activity, financial liberalization requires justification. Because of the features of international financial markets, e.g., that the degree of regulation and integration is a matter of political choice, many of the standard justificatory arguments, for example about the inevitability of capital account liberalization, do not succeed. Relying on the 'due care principle' developed earlier, James argues that global financial integration would be justifiable, only if those who are made worse off by it, for example through financial crises associated with capital account liberalization, can and will be compensated. You must not impose a risk on somebody unless you are in a position to compensate that person in case the harm materializes. But because states are not in a position to compensate the losers of financial crises, they ought to refrain from imposing the risk of financial integration in the first place. Financial globalization as we know it cannot be justified. Only the introduction of capital controls, transaction taxes and a general change in regulatory disposition offer the hope of bringing the practice of international finance in line with the requirements of structural equity.

Chapter 9 turns to a different aspect of the global economy. Here James argues that structural equity requires a radical revision of the existing intellectual property rights regime, i.e., the TRIPS regime of the WTO. Dismissing attempts to justify intellectual property rights by reference to social utility or natural rights, James identifies fairness in trade arguments as the most promising starting point for establishing a strict intellectual property rights regime like TRIPS: intellectual property rights may be justified because they level the playing field of trade and ensure fair competition. Intellectual property rights prevent firms from enjoying the unfair advantage of using ideas that their competitors developed and which they did not pay for. But here is James' catch: whether or not a playing field is leveled depends on whether it realizes the requirements of structural equity. And a global economic system in which developing countries may freely use the ideas currently protected by patents would fare better at the bar of structural equity. Because the seemingly unfair advantage of using somebody else's ideas is necessary for developing countries to reap their fair share of the benefits of international trade, fairness as structural equity requires a radical revision of TRIPS.

The argument of Chapter 10 addresses the challenge that arises from values other than socioeconomic fairness bearing on the justifiability of a global economy: what if a worry about the exploitation of labor and the degradation of the environment require that we close down the social practice of international trade? Instead of achieving fairness within a global economy it might, all things considered, be morally required to close down the global economy. In response to this challenge, James pursues two different strategies. A concern for exploitation, he argues, can (at least partly) be explained within a concern for fairness. We think that low market wages under sweatshop conditions are morally problematic because such working conditions unfairly distribute the burdens and benefits of trade between citizens of developed countries and workers in the developing world. By realizing the requirements of structural equity and by making sure that the right kind of benefits, e.g., poverty relief and development, are provided over time, the otherwise objectionable treatment of workers, e.g., low wages under sweatshop conditions, may be justified. Seemingly problematic instances of exploitation cease to pose moral problems as soon as they occur within a structurally fair global economy. The environment poses a somewhat more serious challenge. While James argues that matters of socioeconomic fairness should inform our approach to climate change, he also admits that if we cannot muster the political will to achieve both structural equity and environmental conservation, then the global economy, because of its effect on nature and the environment, may not be justifiable after all.

James' book marks a significant achievement and will no doubt set standards in the genre of applied global political philosophy. His normative framework for the global economic order is impressive in scope and ambition with few peers in the current literature. Naturally, some elements of a project ranging from foundational questions of method all the way to particular issues in public policy will be less convincing than others. My critical remarks focus on three of them.

My first concern is about James' interpretive or constructivist approach to moral justification. Given that James' normative argument turns on what is allegedly the best interpretation of existing practice (for example when he dismisses a cosmopolitan approach to justice in international trade as unwarranted by the current global economic order) the interpretive approach remains disappointingly vague. Most fundamentally, it remains unclear what exactly the standards of interpretive accuracy should be. There are many different ways of drawing on the various self-understandings of a practice's different participants and, more often than not, the point and purpose of a political practice will be contested among those who run it. Unless there are clear ex ante standards of interpretive success, any interpretation will invite the charge of arbitrariness, diminishing its force in substantive normative argument. And maybe even more worryingly from the point of view of a professional philosopher, justification through interpretation may turn out to be a lot of work. Anyone insisting on a key-role for interpretation will have to go to great (too great?) lengths adjudicating between competing interpretations of legal documents, international treaties, national law, existing regulation, and different schools of economic theory. One may, of course, argue that many of James' normative conclusions and policy proposals don't in fact hang on intricate interpretation, and some readers (I among them) will be much more convinced by the arguments of the later applied parts of the book than by the arguments of the early parts. Unfortunately, such a response would fuel an even deeper worry about the significance of interpretation. When it comes to moral argument, interpreting existing practice may not hurt anyone, but maybe it is not of great help either.

My second set of remarks addresses some of James' policy arguments from the final part of the book. Consider two of them. First, in his argument for the introduction of capital controls and security taxation (Chapter 8), James relies on the idea that states won't be able to compensate the losers of financial crises. According to James, it is only because in a world of capital liberalization in which states lack the power or ability to compensate through social insurance, etc., that states are required to undo financial integration. But if within the global economic order as we know it states lack the power or ability to compensate the losers of financial integration, it is likely that they also lack the power or ability to undo financial integration. If on the other hand, one assumes that states are sufficiently powerful to introduce capital controls and levy an international tax on securities transactions, it remains unclear why exactly they should lack the power to muster other means in order to compensate the losers of financial crisis. In any event, James' case in favor of capital controls and security taxation seems to remain inconclusive. If taxes and capital controls provide a viable policy solution, alternative solutions may work as well. If other solutions are eliminated, taxes and capital controls will be eliminated as well. Or at least, more would have to be said about why they are not.

Second, trying to incorporate independent values into his framework (Chapter 10), James explains how a worry about exploitation may be accommodated within a concern for structural equity. Conditions that we may intuitively characterize as exploitative, e.g., low wage labor under sweatshop conditions, may cease to be exploitative if they occur within a structurally fair global economy. Unfortunately, James seems unaware that his line of reasoning would impoverish our moral vocabulary and prevent us from casting moral judgment where moral judgment clearly has a place. Imagine that within a structurally fair economy, multinational corporations suddenly decide to reform their sweatshops on the model of Swedish factories, increase wages, introduce decent health and safety standards, sponsor unions, etc. Would that not be a moral improvement? And would we not account for such an improvement by saying that there is now less exploitation? Because according to James there was no exploitation to begin with, he could not share this judgment.

Finally, there is a tension which I believe points to a deeper question that theories like James' will have to answer. Grounding his interpretive approach (Chapter 4), James insists that principles of justice for the global economy should give 'conclusive reasons of action' to 'actual world regulators'. Discussing the challenge that ecological degradation may raise for the justifiability of the global economic order (Chapter 10), James admits that whether or not the global economy turns out to be justifiable, depends on whether or not there will be the political will to make it both fair and green. Jointly, these points make an odd couple. The first claim suggests that normative theory has arrived at a sound principle only if there are reasonable prospects that regulators will actually act on it. After all, this is why James' interpretive approach is superior to its cosmopolitan rival. But as the second point highlights, normative theory may also be seen as formulating requirements external to the motivations of actual existing actors. There is then, it appears, an unanswered question about whether or not normative political theory ought to take existing motivations of political actors as given. For James, each definite answer would come at a significant cost: If motivationally remote principles may count as sound principles, the case against non-interpretative and non-practice-dependent approaches is substantially weakened. But if actual motivations are taken as given, and sound principles will have to offer 'conclusive reasons' for 'actual regulators' in the strict sense, normative political theory not only runs into various status quo objections, but the international practice of international trade may after all be unjustifiable. Given that 'actual world regulators' will lack the political will to make the global economy both fair and green, not to have a global economy might be, all things considered, morally required.