Fairness: Theory and Practice of Distributive Justice

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Rescher, Nicholas, Fairness: Theory and Practice of Distributive Justice, Transaction Publishers, 2002, 147pp, $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 0765801108.

Reviewed by Brad Hooker , University of Reading


This short book does not pretend to survey theories about fairness; rather, the book makes a very direct attempt to articulate the truth about what fairness really is. According to Rescher, extant and varying social practices determine what claims people have, and fairness “requires allocations to be made proportionally to the strength of the claims at issue” (p. 12). Rescher’s theory is like Craig L. Carr’s in according social practices a central role. It is also like John Broome’s in focusing on the proportional satisfaction of claims. Along the way, the book discusses procedural impartiality, the relationship between fairness and preferences, the relationship between fairness and bargaining power, what fairness requires when different people have valid claims to be given a good which cannot be divided, and how the benefits of teamwork can be fairly apportioned.

Rescher argues that procedural impartiality is a crucial aspect of fairness (pp. 21-23). There is a familiar distinction between procedural and substantive impartiality. According to this distinction, procedural impartiality consists in the consistent and unbiased application of rules and distinctions. Substantive impartiality goes further. It requires that the rules and distinctions being applied are themselves impartially justified. However, what Rescher means by procedural impartiality is the equal application of rules for which there is a valid rationale (p. 23). So what he means by procedural impartiality builds at least some substantive fairness into procedural impartiality.

The book rightly focuses on substantive fairness. Consider a rule requiring me to try secretly to harm every tenth person I meet. I might consistently follow this rule no matter who the victims will be. Thus, I’m applying my rule impartially. But my rule is itself substantively unfair, because it makes morally irrelevant distinctions.

Which distinctions between people are morally irrelevant and in that way arbitrary? Rescher maintains that the answer will depend on what social practices, conventions, institutions, etc. are around. Consider a society in which people write wills to determine who gets their wealth. Now suppose Uncle John’s will leaves Cousin Robert $1000 and Cousin Ronald $1000 (p. 10). Sadly, Uncle John’s net estate is worth only $1500. Suppose there is nothing in the will to indicate that either cousin’s claim is secondary or residual. And suppose neither cousin has any other relevant claims on the money. Then clearly fairness requires that each get 75% of his claim on the estate.

Some people would say that it can be unfair that Uncle John’s estate goes to Robert and Ronald even if these are Uncle John’s nearest relatives. Presumably the animating thought behind such a complaint is that Robert and Ronald might not deserve that $750 each. It might be thought that what any person deserves is a function of what that person has done (or tried to do). It might also be thought that fairness depends mainly if not entirely upon desert. If those thoughts are correct, then if Robert and Ronald have not done anything special, then how can they deserve the money any more than indefinitely many other people do? And if they don’t deserve the money any more than indefinitely many other people do, how can fairness allow Uncle John’s money to go to Robert and Ronald?

But Rescher says we should resist tying fairness to desert. He points out that someone might freely agree to pay you more for some service than you deserve (p. 2). In this case, Rescher supposes, the person doing the paying is not unfair in paying more than deserved. But, consistently with his basic theory of fairness, Rescher could have left a large role for desert. His basic theory is that fairness is the proportional satisfaction of claims deriving from positive law, existing conventions, actual agreements, etc. He could have added that what someone deserves will depend upon such laws, conventions, agreements, etc.

However, there is a fairly obvious objection to Rescher’s contention that claims derive from positive law, social conventions, existing customs, actual agreements, etc. This objection is that some positive laws, social conventions, and customs have had no purpose other than to give advantages to certain groups or to deny benefits to other groups. Think of the laws and customs that have discriminated against non-whites and women.

Given his theory of fairness, Rescher cannot and does not object to such discriminatory laws and customs on the grounds of fairness. He is emphatic that “claims determine fairness and not the other way around” (p. 6). He nevertheless sees that there must be some test that existing social practices must pass in order to generate valid claims. His proposal is that “rational validation of a claim” depends not only on its being grounded in an existing social practice but also on there being “good reason to think that the practice at issue is one that redounds, on balance, to the advantage of the group as a whole” (p. 8).

Suppose “the advantage of the group as a whole” is read as referring to some particular group (some proper subset of individuals). If it is read this way, then Rescher’s test is still too permissive. Suppose the people of Imperium aim to take over the world. Suppose some of their social practices distribute claims in such a way as to maximize the probability of success in their imperialistic aim. For example, these social practices award riches to Imperium’s most bloodthirsty warriors and to inventors of its best weapons, riches obtained by taxation on Imperium’s citizens. Suppose Imperium does take over the world and then delights in rewarding itself with most of the power and riches in the world. Imperium thrives; the rest of the world suffers. Now I can make the point of this example. Imperium’s practices of rewarding its most bloodthirsty warriors and the inventors of its best weapons illustrate that there can be social practices that redound, on balance, to the advantage of a group and yet do not generate valid moral claims.

To fix this problem, we have to say that the social practice must redound, on balance, not just to the advantage of one group but to the advantage of everyone (taken collectively). Of course some social practices rightly focus on the needs or interests of only certain people. Such focus is fine, as long as there is a background justification for allowing the practice, in terms of the well-being of everyone. Herein we find a connection between fairness and impartiality. Only a social practice that is impartially justified, in the sense that the justification takes into account everyone’s well-being, can generate valid moral claims.

Rescher himself goes in precisely this direction. He observes that what fairness calls for is consistency in following rules that “rest on an adequate rationale of social-benefit considerations” (p. 21). And he writes, “[F]airness … consists in conforming distributive practices to impersonal rules of procedure that are justified on the basis of efficacy in serving the legitimate purposes of the human community” (p. 23). “Fairness in division itself becomes a process that reflects the aims and purposes that are at issue in the context within which that division is made” (p. 120). And the aim of ethics is “to foster principles of interaction that induce people to act for the general welfare and the common good” (p. 121).

But what if the social practice itself prescribes that the individual with the strongest claim wins everything, as opposed to merely a greater share in proportion to the claim’s relative superiority? In fact, Rescher points out that there is a whole class of such cases. These are cases where different individuals have competing claims to some pre-owned thing (ch. 6).

Suppose some property is found and two people come forward to claim it. One points out that he can identify the property. The other possesses a bill of sale with her name on it as the purchaser. As Rescher rightly says, the legal and social practice is “predominantist”, i.e., to give all the good to the one with the strongest claim. In such cases, fairness does not require division in proportion to the strength of the claims, but instead a ’winner-take-all’ approach.

Rescher makes two interesting points about the predominantist approach to pre-ownership cases. This approach seems to be justified in rule-consequentialist terms. Imagine how insecure would be your ownership of, e.g., your bicycle if other people could obtain rights to shares in it simply by coming forward with some reasons for believing that the bicycle is theirs. Even though you had the key that unlocks the lock on it, even though you had a bill of sale for it, other people might claim that they own it, with their evidence being that their friends testify to this. As Rescher points out, if proportionalism rather than predominantism were the practice with respect to pre-owned property, then we would divert our resources away from improving what we have into insuring our continued possession of it (p. 98). Because of such “incentive effects”, the expected-value of having a public policy of deciding pre-ownership cases by proportionalism is lower than the expected-value of having a public policy of deciding them by predominantism.

Rescher’s other interesting point about these pre-ownership cases is that they are actually evidential, rather than moral (p. 92). In pre-ownership cases, obviously someone already owns something. And the question is whether the strength of the evidence for thinking A owns it is stronger than the evidence for thinking B owns it. Presumably, the fact that someone owns something is (at least largely) what Nozick called a side-constraint, a reason that settles the issue of whether to give it to that person. Fairness surely requires compliance with whatever side-constraints there are. It is open to Rescher, however, to say that side-constraints are determined by those positive laws and existing social practices that on the whole promote the aggregate good.

Rescher emphasizes that fairness is determined ultimately by justified social practices, not by the parties’ preferences or bargaining power (pp. 29-32). What matters from the point of view of fairness is not how much Cousin Robert or Cousin Ronald wants Uncle John’s money, nor how much each would envy the other’s inheritance. Rescher’s main argument for keeping fairness separate from preference satisfaction and subjective feelings is that people’s preferences and feelings can be variable, unstable, and irrational (pp. 31-32). Although Rescher’s argument here is quite plausible, it is very thinly sketched. He says even less in support of his rejection of bargaining power as a determinate of fairness. But some of the sting is taken out of that rejection by his admission that, after a distribution is fairly made, “if the parties choose to renegotiate it in light of power considerations, then that’s their business.” (p. 29) Similarly, if, because of different preferences, the parties choose to exchange with one another what has been fairly distributed to them, fairness cannot object (p. 31).

Although the book sometimes refers to its theory of fairness as a kind of pragmatism, the theory would be more revealingly described as a sort of rule-consequentialism. Fairness is a matter of satisfying claims that derive from those social practices that on the whole promote the aggregate good. Claims are to be satisfied in proportion to their strength, but that strength is determined by the social practice that is itself justified in broadly rule-consequentialist terms.

To be sure, as Rescher stresses, satisfying legitimate claims does not always maximize general welfare: “Fairness aims at equity, at equitable treatment … . It is an instrumentality of justice and equity, not of welfare and utility, save insofar as the pursuit of equity at large conduces to the general welfare” (p. 14; see also pp. 94–5). So the rationale for thinking in terms of claims and their satisfaction has to be rule-consequentialist, not act-consequentialist. I think Rescher effectively concedes this when he writes:

What we have here is not act-pragmatism (’Take that course of action which is optimally efficient and effective …’). Instead, its pragmatic thrust functions at the policy level because in the contingency of affairs individual outcomes are inherently less predictable than general tendencies. Observe that the situation is structurally much the same here as that of the act-utilitarianism vs. rule-utilitarianism conflict in moral theory.

Unfortunately, that acknowledgement does not appear until the very last endnote in the book (p. 123n2).